Challenging Liberalism: Feminism as Political Critique

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Lisa Schwartzman, Challenging Liberalism: Feminism as Political Critique, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2006, 210pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 027102853X.

Reviewed by Rebecca Whisnant, University of Dayton


In Challenging Liberalism: Feminism as Political Critique, Lisa Schwartzman brings her sharp interpretive and critical perspective to bear on the vexed relationship between feminism and liberal political philosophy.  Noting (as have others before her) that the latter's central values -- such as autonomy, individual rights, and equality -- are both indispensable to and sometimes problematic for feminism, Schwartzman argues that these values must be reinterpreted in light of the insights gained from an alternative, non-liberal, and specifically feminist philosophical methodology.  In this book, she explains why such an alternative methodology is needed, outlines some of its distinctive features, and compares it favorably to the assumptions and concomitant methodologies of both liberalism and feminist postmodernism.

While Schwartzman's criticism of liberalism is wide-ranging, two aspects of liberal methodology are most consistently in her crosshairs: its individualism and its abstraction.  Again, she is not the first feminist philosopher to criticize abstraction and/or individualism -- whether liberal or otherwise -- but the criticisms have rarely been fleshed out as fully and clearly as they are here.  Schwartzman's strength is in demonstrating just how it is that these methods, as employed by central liberal figures such as Rawls and Dworkin, import problematic assumptions and lead to unpalatable (or at least highly suspect) conclusions.  I commend to the reader's attention her detailed and cogent critiques of these authors, since I cannot do them justice in a short review; here I will just attempt to summarize her central charges against liberal abstraction and individualism as such. 

The individualism that Schwartzman targets is not a metaphysical assumption about human nature, but rather a mode of inquiry that "focus[es] primarily on each and every individual as an individual, rather than also calling attention to the social context and to the relations of power in which individuals live" (p. 7).  Her critique of such individualism comes into clear focus in her response (in Chapter 5) to Martha Nussbaum's defense of feminist liberalism.  Nussbaum points out that patriarchy harms women by treating them as appendages to and/or natural servants of men, and as obligated to uphold the (often patriarchal) values and practices of their culture, nation, and/or religion.  It is thus crucial, according to Nussbaum, that we do precisely as liberalism recommends, and pay attention to the rights and well-being of each person as an individual distinct from others.  As she puts it, "The central question of politics should not be, How is the organic whole doing?, but rather, How are X and Y and Z and Q doing?" 

While granting that each woman's status as (in Kantian terms) an end in herself is frequently denied in and by patriarchy, Schwartzman blocks Nussbaum's assumption that a liberal-individualist mode of inquiry is sufficient to uncover and combat such denial.  In short, it is not enough to ask how X and Y and Z and Q are each doing; we must also ask what X and Y and Z and Q may have in common with each other, in virtue of which all are doing poorly, and in some similar ways, and for some similar reasons.  "What is needed," Schwartzman contends, "is an analysis of social structures of power … . Feminists differ from communitarians and from liberals in that it is neither the entire community/religion/nation upon which we focus, nor is it simply the individual.  What makes feminism unique is its focus on the group women" (p. 106).  While liberalism can condemn the maltreatment of each woman as an individual, its individualist methodology prevents it from perceiving the systematic and group-based obstacles to the flourishing of female individuals as such. 

The abstraction to which Schwartzman objects in liberal methodology involves bracketing, setting aside, or disregarding certain features of persons and/or of the social world for the purpose of theory construction.  She argues that "abstract" models such as Rawls' original position and Dworkin's desert island auction "are not in fact as abstract as they purport to be" -- that these models covertly import some concrete and biasing assumptions that enable important power structures to remain invisible and unchallenged in the resulting theories.  Thus, while Schwartzman does not reject all philosophical uses of abstraction (or bracketing), she contends that "liberal methods of abstraction often permit objectionable features of the social structure to enter a theory despite the bracketing" (p. 160).

One way in which she mobilizes this criticism against Rawls provides a useful contrast with her own recommended methodology.  She considers attempts by feminist liberals -- in particular, Susan Moller Okin -- to redeploy Rawls' original-position argument for feminist purposes, arguing that such attempts are doomed to fail.  According to Schwartzman (and contra Okin), Rawls' exclusion of gender as a "relevant social position" is not an easily-remediable oversight.  Rather it results from his view of how such positions should be identified: namely, by asking what the relevant social positions would be in a "well-ordered society."  Thus, Schwartzman's criticism here concerns (as she says) "the very meaning of a 'relevant social position' in an ideal theory": because Rawls does not think that gender would be relevant to people's chances of a good life in an ideal society, he does not include it as a relevant social position. 

It is thus for good reason, by his own theoretical lights, that -- as Schwartzman points out, again contra Okin -- Rawls specifically blocks parties in the original position from considering their knowledge of society's current structures (including, presumably, its gender structures): "facts about current and historical patterns of social domination and oppression … are precisely the sort of information Rawls excludes" (65).  The problem with abstraction of this kind, Schwartzman argues, is that it abstracts away from the very features of the social world that we most need to understand in order to change them -- thus virtually ensuring that those features will remain unchallenged in the resulting theory, which in turn will fail to contribute to changing them in the world.  If we refuse to pay attention to a certain power structure (whether of gender, race, class, or something else) in the process of theory construction, the governing assumptions of that power structure are likely to pass unmolested into our theory, and into the "ideal" society therein described. 

A theorist can "miss" a form or element of oppression either by importing it into his or her supposedly-abstract model unacknowledged and thus unchallenged (as she argues is true of Dworkin's desert-island auction model) or by excluding it precisely because s/he thinks it would not play an important role in an ideal society (as she argues Rawls does with gender).  In either case, Schwartzman contends, the theory will fail to provide either a clear critique of existing injustice or a vision of truly liberatory alternatives.  Oppressive social relationships can be identified and challenged, she argues, only via a mode of inquiry that focuses on social groups and their relationships to existing power structures and that, as it were, acknowledges and embraces its own concreteness.  She thus recommends, in her concluding chapter, a methodology that "does not proceed by bracketing all questions about actual society, but rather begins with an examination of power relations in an attempt to understand, criticize, and ultimately change these arrangements" (p. 169). 

Some readers will likely question whether it is the job of political philosophers, particularly of those doing "ideal theory," to generate critical analyses of existing societies.  So long as the ideal one defends is truly just (one might protest), it may legitimately be left to others -- at least to those doing non-ideal theory and, further afield, to those in other academic disciplines -- to articulate the respects in which current social reality differs from that ideal.  The objection here, in other words, would rely on a certain assumed division of labor both within communities of scholarship and, more broadly, between scholarship and activism.  Anticipating this objection, Schwartzman contends in response that "the process of devising an ideal is never entirely independent from the context of one's own (nonideal) society" (p. 60).  Envisioning a fully just society requires, she says, "a careful, contextual analysis of the mechanisms of domination and oppression in our own society" (p. 73) because, absent such an analysis, the assumptions that generate and govern those mechanisms are likely to find their way into our ideal, whether we realize it or not.  As she demonstrates through numerous examples, theorists' "inattention to power structures can reinforce and perpetuate sexism, racism, and class oppression" (p. 161).  

In the book's third section, Schwartzman sharply distinguishes her own criticisms of liberalism from those of prominent feminist post-modernists Wendy Brown and Judith Butler.  While the details of Schwartzman's criticisms of Brown and Butler respectively are well worth any reader's attention, I will focus here on some central points common to both critiques.  In short, Schwartzman shows that these theorists' resources for uncovering and challenging oppression are, if anything, even more sparse than those of liberalism.  Like the liberals she has criticized so far, Brown and Butler do not "devise structural or systemic analyses of the experience of oppression," but rather focus relentlessly on individuals.  But unlike liberals, Brown and Butler not only eschew such analysis themselves, but denounce its being done by others: whereas the liberal theorist says (in effect) that systematic, empirically-grounded social criticism is "not my job," Brown and Butler contend that such criticism is not anyone's job.  For instance, both theorists deny that women's speech can be used (in Schwartzman's words) "to draw any general conclusions that would apply beyond their own particular situations" (p. 115).  In this respect and others, Brown's and Butler's theoretical approach is studiously apolitical; they advocate only "personal, individual acts of resistance" while casting a consistently wary eye at the tactics and assumptions of social movements resisting systemic oppression.

Another difference between liberals and feminist postmodernists is that while the former attempt to articulate governing ideals (as of justice, equality, and the like), the latter assume -- largely without argument -- that any appeal to ideals, or to any "normative view of the person," will (as Schwartzman puts it) "inevitably reinforce current social norms" (p. 152).  They thus reject any attempt to replace oppressive norms with new, non-oppressive norms, preferring instead that we engage in what Brown calls "politics," which she describes as "a terrain of struggle without fixed or metaphysical referents" (quoted in Schwartzman, p. 125).  But as Schwartzman observes, in the absence both of liberatory norms and of any understanding of systemic power, "the battles that Brown advocates as 'sheerly political' would amount to libertarian struggles in which anything is acceptable and in which those who have power from the start would be most likely to prevail" (p. 127).  Here Schwartzman hints at a criticism that merits further exploration: that much feminist postmodernism is not radical social criticism at all, but rather a kind of closet libertarianism.    

Schwartzman's criticism of Brown and Butler is undertaken with admirable patience and interpretive charity.  She suggests, in short, that feminist postmodernists have covertly adopted the most problematic features of liberalism while determinedly rejecting those elements of liberalism which, suitably reframed, are potentially liberatory.  If she is correct (and I think she is), then the feminist postmodernist project -- at least as represented by Brown and Butler -- is a fundamentally regressive one. 

In addition to its scholarly contribution, Schwartzman's book will be very valuable for teaching purposes.  For students learning to do philosophy, she provides a wonderful model of charitable interpretation and responsible criticism, always considering any resources a theorist may have available for responding to her objections, even if he or she does not do so explicitly.  The chapters on Dworkin and Rawls could stand easily on their own, as critical feminist perspectives to integrate into a political philosophy course.  The critiques of Brown and Butler are especially exciting for those of us teaching courses in feminist theory who may have searched, largely in vain, for work that clearly articulates and engages the differences between postmodernist and radical feminist perspectives (rather than treating both uncritically as incommensurable worldviews).   

As Schwartzman makes clear throughout, the methodology she defends in this book is not new: it is essentially the methodology of radical feminism (and of other radical movements for social justice), and it can be observed in the work of social theorists like Catharine MacKinnon, Mari Matsuda, and many others.  In valorizing this methodology as essential to even the most general and "idealized" forms of political philosophy, Schwartzman has done a significant service, both to political philosophy itself and to the social movements -- most centrally, second-wave radical feminism -- from which her alternative methodology emerges.  I look forward to seeing her carry out, in her future work, the mode of inquiry that she has cogently defended here.