Character and Moral Psychology

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Christian B. Miller, Character and Moral Psychology, Oxford University Press, 2014, 269pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199674367.

Reviewed by John M. Doris, Washington University in St. Louis and Joseph Spino, University of Illinois at Urbana-Champaign


Christian Miller's book, together with its companion volume, Moral Character (2013), is among the most substantial -- and among the very best -- contributions to the virtue ethics and situationism debate. The main issues have been familiar to psychologists since the 1960's, and have occasionally made appearances in philosophy (Alston 1975; Flanagan 1991), but philosophical discussion heated up in the early 2000s, as philosophers began debating character skepticism.[1] While there is enough interesting material in the book to justify multiple reviews, we will focus on Miller's relation to this debate.

This emphasis results in more omission than inclusion. Most regrettably, to concentrate on the philosophical debate is to neglect Miller's significant contributions to discussion of personality in psychology.[2] Miller offers insightful critique of Walter Mischel's Cognitive Affective Personality System model, which has occasionally been appropriated by philosophers seeking to develop empirically informed defenses of virtue ethics (e.g., Snow 2010), and also provides probing discussion of the Big Five model, which is probably the dominant approach in contemporary personality psychology. But Miller, unlike many empirically involved philosophers working on character, is not a situationist critic of personality; indeed, he pointedly questions situationist approaches to personality (or situationist refusals to approach personality).

However, Miller's project is not primarily negative. He develops a novel "mixed trait" framework for understanding character; it is this positive theory, and its relation to character skepticism, which will occupy our discussion here. (In as much as this framework is central in both Moral Character and Character and Moral Psychology, our comments span both texts.)

Character skepticism targets the contemporary tradition of virtue ethics, a family of views, frequently classical in origin, resurgent over the past 50 years or so.[3] Skeptics argue that the virtue ethical understanding of character -- consisting in global traits effecting cross-situationally consistent behavior -- is undermined by a large body of findings in social psychology's situationist tradition (combined with convergent strains of evidence from other fields, such as personality and cognitive psychology).[4] Put simply, the skeptical claim is that people don't often behave as consistently as familiar theories of character would have us expect, which is supposed to imply that global traits are not widely instantiated in actual human populations.[5]

One response is to contend, as defenders of philosophical positions often do, that the skeptics misfire, and assert that the virtue ethics tradition is not committed to global traits (e.g., Hurka 2006). Since Miller, like us, construes the debate as one concerning global traits, we will not here discuss the interpretive issues engendered by the "misfire" rejoinder. Another response, dubbed the "dodge" by Alfano (2013: 62-64), is to interpret virtue theory as primarily normative, and largely devoid of empirical content. On this expedient, talk of virtue is evaluative talk, which can fulfill its role whether or not the psychological structures it depicts are instantiated in actual human beings. That this is a perspicuous understanding of important strains in philosophical (and everyday) thinking on character, or an independently appealing approach to philosophical ethics, is disputable; certainly, "psychological realism" is often treated as a desiderata for ethical theories in general (e.g., Flanagan 1991; Besser-Jones 2014), and virtue-ethical theories in particular.

In any event, it's not the strategy Miller adopts. Rather than dodging, he's confronting: Miller addresses the empirical challenge head on, with an authoritative accounting of evidence the character skeptics themselves rely on. The resulting view is both interesting and unusual. Miller is not, as might be expected for a critic of situationism, a defender of virtue ethics; he argues that traditional virtue and vices are largely absent from the human population. But like many proponents of virtue ethics, Miller insists, contra the character skeptics, that human behavior is frequently ordered by global character traits that effect cross-situationally consistent behavior.

According to Miller (2014: 195), there is a type of global trait that most people possess, which he calls mixed. Mixed traits are neither virtues nor vices, because they do not reliably dispose the possessor to good or bad behavior in every situation (Miller 2014: 207-209). Rather than having virtues or vices, the vast majority of people possess such traits as mixed aggression traits, mixed helping traits, mixed cheating traits, and so on -- traits that sometimes issue in behavior conforming to the behavior type featured in their names, and other times not. But these traits are supposed to be operative across a wide range of situations, and therefore deserve to be termed global. Thus, while Miller argues for a globalist theory of character, he remains a skeptic about virtue and vice; although global traits are widely instantiated, evaluatively consistent virtues and vices aren't.

Miller (2013; 2014) offers detailed consideration of the various psychological experiments that have been exploited by the skeptics, but unlike some opponents of character skepticism, he does not disregard or debunk this extensive literature. He does, however, deny that this literature tells for the sort of behavioral inconsistency the skeptics get on about. Making use of a distinction made prominent by Mischel and colleagues (Mischel and Shoda 1995; Shoda 1999), Miller (2014: 54-55) argues that the appearance of pervasive behavioral inconsistency results from overfocusing on nominal features of situations (e.g., low levels of light), rather than psychological features of situations (e.g., the subject's mood). For Miller, the psychological features facilitate the expression of mixed traits; activation or inhibition of mixed traits by psychological features of the situation effects orderly patterns of morally relevant behavior, such as those involving helping and failing to help.

If behavior is understood this way, Miller says, apparent inconsistency resolves. For example, suppose a person consistently helps in situations when they are in a good mood and consistently doesn't help when in a bad mood. When behavior is categorized by reference to nominal situations, say those where there is a social norm mandating helping, behavioral inconsistency is mistakenly attributed to people with mood-dependent helpfulness. While these people are not globally helpful, so the story goes, they are globally mood-dependent-helpful. For Miller, mixed traits are an empirically supported species of global trait that is widely instantiated in the population (Miller 2014: 195, 200).

Miller's position appears well equipped to handle much of the skepticism leveled at global character traits. But matters complicate when we consider just how many enhancers and inhibitors may be at work in a single mixed trait. Consider the example of someone alleviating guilt by helping others, which is a component of their mixed helping trait. All else being equal, helping while guilty is supposed to be consistent across a wide-variety of situations. But it is doubtful that all else will often be equal. On Miller's (2013: 183) own description, there are many additional psychological factors beyond guilt that need to be accounted for, such as emotions, beliefs, and desires. When all of these factors are considered, it looks as though the relevant admixture of inhibitors and enhancers effecting any instance of helping behavior will approach the singular, meaning that behavior again looks highly situationally specific, just the circumstance the skeptics were crowing about.

In situation s, say, x amount of guilt, y amount of embarrassment, z amount of anger (to name only three), plus beliefs and desires related to s-like situations, generally results in behavior b. Is it reasonable to expect that the same psychological mixture will congeal in different situations? After all, any circumstance may be supposed to involve some indefinitely large number of psychological features, some of which may be unique (or approaching unique), and these various features may figure in some indefinitely large number of combinations, which may themselves be unique (or approaching unique). Why suppose the psychological features and their combinations will repeat, or repeat with anything like the regularity needed to effect behavioral consistency?

You're in a good mood today, but will you ever again be in a good mood because it is the day you were awarded tenure in your first job? You were in a bad mood last fall, but will you ever again be in a bad mood because it's the day the Democrats got hammered in the 2014 midterm elections? If many psychological situations matter to mixed traits, and their appearance and combination in any given life cannot readily be expected to be highly reliable, it becomes rather difficult to see how mixed traits can, absent a highly fortuitous confluence of circumstances, be expected to secure cross-situationally consistent behavior -- which problematizes thinking of them as global traits.

This circumstance may seem to put Miller in an awkward position regarding an important desideratum in theory choice; ceteris paribus, simpler theories are preferred over more complex ones. How simplicity ought be understood is, of course, the subject of much discussion (see Dacey, in preparation; Mackonis 2013). But mixed traits, considering the numerousness of their situational inputs, psychological processes, and behavioral outputs, are anything but simple. Still, we don't think Miller need be embarrassed on this score; human psychology is complex, and a complex theory may be the only sort fit to secure empirical adequacy.[6]

More worrisome is that mixed trait theory may fare poorly with regard to what we might call, rather imprecisely, informativeness. Talk of behavioral consistency, particularly within the virtue ethics tradition, typically proceeds in the context of an evaluative benchmark: e.g., Sam fails to possess the trait of compassion (and is morally censurable for doing so) because he does not behave consistently with respect to the normative standards associated with compassion (e.g., the obligation to offer help where help is needed and one is readily able to offer it). What standards are relevant to mixed-traits? According to Miller:

A person with a Mixed Trait will often show momentary or extended cross-situational consistency in his behavior in situations relevant to that trait, when those situations are compared based upon the features which are psychologically salient to him. (2014: 57)

On this view, the relevant benchmark for consistency is not an evaluative norm, but the psychology of the individual actor.

Is this the kind of consistency character-based ethical theories seek? Or is it rather too easy to come by? Indeed, within the mixed trait framework, it's hard to see what acting inconsistently would look like.[7] With so many enhancers and inhibitors at play for each trait, there will always be some combination of psychological factors construable as one or another mixed trait.

An account like Miller's might avoid such a problem, were it to identify non-arbitrary standards for grouping together a particular set of beliefs, desires, and other psychological features of situations as the grounds for attributing a mixed trait. But on Miller's description of mixed traits, it looks like any psychological disposition associated with the behavior of interest -- or its absence -- is to be welcomed as another component of the mixed trait.[8] When providing a mixed trait explanation, one can always recruit additional psychological factors to demonstrate why it is the mixed trait was involved in the causal process. Aggression, for instance, could have been caused by feelings of anger, frustration, shame, or a desire to maintain a positive self-image. This is only a partial list, which Miller (2013: 271-272) doesn't suppose is comprehensive; the concern is that the inclusion of so many enhancers and inhibitors means the mixed trait construct can be so extensively qualified that it fails to make a particular behavior more intelligible. To say someone's aggression was effected by her possession of a mixed aggression trait seems to reduce to saying her aggression was caused by whatever psychological factors were associated with that particular instance of aggression -- this mixed aggression trait bears an uncomfortable resemblance to a virtus dormitiva. (It's fair to note, however, that if Miller has this trouble, it may well be trouble he shares with much trait theory.)

Consider the familiar thought that people sometimes act "out of character." All parties to the debate would likely admit that most people do not act in accordance with their character, whatever form it may take, 100% of the time. But on the mixed trait framework, one can explain any behavior as being in-character -- in some mixed character, that is. The person who fails to act helpfully in circumstances where they have always done so previously can be said to be acting in character after all; on the mixed trait framework, there may be a novel psychological situation such that, were we aware of it, we would expect the behavior that was observed. For example, suppose Sara has been observed consistently being helpful when in a good mood, and consistently unhelpful when in a bad mood, but is then seen being consistently helpful even in situations where her mood is especially foul. Say it turns out that Sara's helpfulness has been significantly enhanced by the presence of her co-workers at a new job, where she is trying to foster friendship with a new peer group (and no additional helpfulness is observed elsewhere). The psychological situation causing this newly observed helpfulness could just be taken as a new feature of her mixed helpfulness trait, rather than a significant departure from her character.

The general point is that to talk of consistency simpliciter isn't a helpful notion; to be informative, consistency must be identified relative to some standard. The worry we've just been articulating is that every pattern of behavior is consistent relative to some standard, but many of these consistencies may be uninformative or trivial. The run of behaviors a, d, g, h, j p, p, f, a is consistent relative to the disposition (or family of dispositions) to produce just that run of behaviors -- call it disposition ADGHJPPFA, but we've learned relatively little of interest about a person when we learn of such regularities.

This, of course, raises the question of what consistencies are the interesting ones. Presently, there's no need to answer this question; the important point here is that if one is interested in one sort of consistency, one won't necessarily be satisfied by finding consistency of another kind. Take a very simple mixed trait having to do with honesty: interval honesty. Greg is possessed of interval honesty, which means that, like an athlete alternating periods of exertion and recovery, when Greg avails himself of an opportunity to exercise honesty, he needs to "sit out" the next opportunity; Greg has psychological resources sufficient only to exercise honesty in every other honesty relevant situation. If we let h stand for honest behavior, and d stand for dishonest behavior, Greg's honesty relevant behavior will look, quite uniformly, like this: hdhdhdhdhdhdhd.

This, you might think, deserves to be called a kind of consistency; it is, as Miller might put it, behavior indicative of a global mixed trait. The consistency, of course, is relative to psychological situations: ones where Greg is morally exhausted and ones where he is not. What about nominal situations? There's some evidence that people's attributive standards for honesty are rather demanding (Gidron et al. 1993); to earn the title of honesty, you have to be honest on some tolerably high percentage of the occasions where honesty is called for. That's not Greg, who is honest only half the time it's appropriate. (If you think that's a "tolerably high percentage," imagine attaching it to a friend. Better not turn your back!) The general point is that identifying psychological consistency does not secure nominal consistency (Doris 2002: 76-85). Miller won't object to this, of course; his mixed traits are characterized by psychological consistency, not nominal consistency.

But virtue ethicists -- and we think, many others -- are unlikely to be so sanguine. Again, talk of virtue is evaluative talk, referencing evaluative standards, and it is plausibly thought that these standards have to do with nominal consistency. Being virtuous, like being a professional, involves doing your best work when you don't particularly feel like it; if there's a virtue of honesty, Greg, with his reliable tendency to moral failure and recovery, certainly doesn't have it. That is, the standard of consistency relevant for the virtue of honesty evidently involves nominal situations.

Matters may be different with different traits. A person doesn't lose the title of charity because they pass on opportunities to give when they judge the cause unworthy; perhaps the attribution of charity requires consistent giving (within a person's means) to causes the person judges to be worthwhile. If that's true, specification of psychological situations is integral to understanding how charitable a person is. But however this gets sorted out, it needs to get sorted out in a way that limits individual latitude: the skinflint who finds no cause worthy isn't charitable. Which is just to say what we've been saying: nominal situations matter, too.

None of this need concern Miller; his understanding of traits is best construed as revisionary, and he doesn't need to be defending familiar examples of traits. Nor, perhaps, will Miller unduly fret our complaints about uninformativeness. In the first instance, his mixed-trait framework is offered as a descriptively adequate account of character. Descriptive adequacy be should not necessarily be expected to secure an explanatory desideratum like informativeness; the best theory of character, like the best theory of the cosmos, might not be readily understandable without extended examination, or even formal instruction. But this is not, of course, to say that it is false. Miller's theory is systematic and empirically well supported; this doesn't mean it is easy.

Neither is descriptive adequacy undermined if the descriptions in question fail to conform with some evaluative standard, such as those associated with the virtues; that the descriptive and evaluative don't always pull together is the commonest of commonplaces. Miller, as we've said, should not be cast as a defender of virtue ethics (pace Annas 2011: 173n8), but as defending a conception of character traits that is a major departure from the understandings presupposed by such theories. Indeed, Miller (2014: 210) describes his view has presenting a challenge to virtue ethics. Might the lesson of Miller's excellent book be that to move in the direction of a psychologically realistic understanding of traits is to depart from the moral psychology of character that has hitherto animated virtue ethics?


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[1] For references, click here.

[2] We're also sorry to neglect Miller's (2014: 227 ff.) views on cultivating virtues, which will interest moral philosophers.

[3] Anscombe (1958) is conventionally regarded as the locus classicus.

[4] We firmly counsel against characterizing the issue as whether or not character traits exist. Character theorists and character skeptics typically agree that traits exist; the question concerns how traits are best construed (Doris 2005, forthcoming).

[5] For some skeptics, this descriptive claim is paired with a normative claim to the effect that notions of character and virtue predicated on global trait constructs are ethically infelicitous, and should be eliminated from, or minimized in, ethical thought.

[6] Indeed, local trait theory (Doris 2002; Upton 2009), which also makes empirical adequacy paramount, may also fail standards of simplicity.

[7] Miller (2013: 20n38) briefly notes this worry; he suggests that mixed trait theory allows for inconsistency in terms of conflict between an actor's conscious and unconscious psychological states.  We'd like to hear more, since a mixed trait could be specified in terms of just such a conflict: e.g., a mixed aggression trait where the possessor is aggressive when experiencing a conflict between conscious deference and unconscious resentment and passive when the conflict is between conscious resentment and unconscious deference.

[8] For some of Miller's discussion of these issues, in particular with respect to mixed helping traits, see Miller (2013: 180-199).