Children in Medical Research: Access Versus Protection

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Lainie Friedman Ross, Children in Medical Research: Access Versus Protection, Oxford University Press, 285pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199273287.

Reviewed by David Archard, Lancaster University


This book is a systematic critical exploration of the development of policy within the United States in respect of the involvement of children in medical research. The subtitle of the book indicates the balance of ethical considerations -- between the access of children to such research and their adequate protection against unnecessary harms. On the whole, Ross recognizes the importance of pediatric research but wishes to ensure that it is always conducted in a way that minimizes risk. Essentially the book proceeds by examining the development and current operation of regulations in the United States in this area. Thus it is not so much a detached ethical review of the principal underlying issues as it is an immanent critique of existing practice. Throughout the book, Ross makes recommendations for amending rules or adding new ones. These are always judicious and thoughtful. The book is also distinguished by the use of a number of interesting case studies in which empirical data is displayed. Thus Chapter 4 reveals the overrepresentation of Black children and parents and the underrepresentation of Hispanic children and their parents in pediatric research, whilst Chapter 7 discloses the fact that a small but non-trivial number of published pediatric research articles did not receive appropriate ethical approval.

With two exceptions the book's fifteen chapters have previously appeared as published articles. Whilst Ross does seek to display interconnections, and whilst there are evident unifying themes, the book does read all too often as a series of freestanding pieces, a collection rather than a single monograph. Ross is also explicit that her book is written from a US perspective and she concentrates, almost exclusively, on US policy. She suggests that her comments and recommendations are relevant to those outside the States to the extent that other countries have similar polices. But her references to other countries' policies are very sparing and her treatment of American regulations is very specific. It is thus not always easy to grasp the general principles of policy that are being defended.

This is compounded by the fact that Ross's underlying ethical commitments are defended elsewhere, in her previous book, Children, Families and Health Care Decision Making (1998). There she argued for a position of considerable relevance to the discussions of the present book. Ross believes in what she terms 'constrained parental autonomy', namely that parents are not simply duty bound to act in what are the child's best interests but do have considerable discretionary rights to bring up their child as they see fit. However, although they may do what does not in fact promote the child's best interests, they may not do that which sacrifices the child's basic needs. In determining what this might be it is always important to balance respect for a child's current autonomy with respect for the future autonomy of the later adult. Unfortunately Ross does not defend these views here but simply summarises them and shows how they are relevant to the formulation of her preferred policy.

As a consequence, the book overall is long on the provision of empirical information and the review of how American regulations operate, and short on ethical argument. A telling example is Chapter 1, which in part summarises the famous and influential exchange between Paul Ramsey and Richard McCormick about the moral permissibility of parental consent to the use of children in medical research. The issues at stake are important ones: to what extent can parents be proxy decision makers for their own children? Can consent to what we ought to choose be presumed where we cannot in fact obtain consent? But Ross does not adjudicate. Rather she considers these views as elements within an evolving historical debate. Chapter 1 thus reads as an exercise in intellectual history rather than as the philosophical analysis and evaluation that would have been more welcome.

On those occasions when she does engage in a philosophical consideration of matters, her writing is balanced, fair minded and illuminating. Chapter 8 is a good example. There she considers the moral permissibility of payment being given to children for their participation in research. She is rightly sceptical about the view that research subjects should only be altruistically motivated, that payment always subverts voluntary consent, and that payment results in an unjust selection of subjects. She concludes that child-subjects are owed, as are adults, fair compensation for their participation in research although the form and amount may need to be varied.

The overall model Ross employs for evaluating pediatric research is a familiar one that involves the asking of a series of interlinked questions. Does the research carry minimal or more than minimal risks? Does the research have anticipated benefits for those who participate? Are the anticipated benefits proportionate to the risks? Is the involvement of children necessary? Has the consent of one or both parents to the involvement of their children been obtained? Ross has some interesting things to say about how each of these questions is to be understood and answered. For instance, she reviews the various baselines against which risk might be measured (a child suffering this condition or any child); she outlines the various kinds of benefits that might be obtained from participation in research; she considers under what circumstances it might be appropriate to secure consent from only one parent, and so on. This is helpful. But the basic model and its constituent justificatory elements are left unchallenged, and many of the discussions are philosophically comparatively thin. All too often the reader is simply referred to Ross's earlier book.

Moreover, what is essentially at stake in this book is the question of how we should balance the interests of children, the rights and duties of parents, and broader considerations of the public good and social justice. This question is not one specific to biomedical and public health ethics. It is, for example, to be found raised in any consideration of child protection or education policies. Yet this book is narrowly focused -- the literature it reviews and the debates it summarises are all to be found in a very well-defined domain. Ross's heart is certainly in the right place, and anyone seeking a survey of American regulatory practice on pediatric research will find a comprehensive, extensively documented one in her book. It is only to be regretted that the substantive philosophical discussions informing the survey have taken place off stage and make only a fleeting appearance here.