Choosing Tomorrow's Children: The Ethics of Selective Reproduction

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Stephen Wilkinson, Choosing Tomorrow's Children: The Ethics of Selective Reproduction, Oxford University Press, 2010, 265pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199273966.

Reviewed by Mary B. Mahowald, University of Chicago


In recent decades, ethical issues raised by anticipated advances in biological research and technology have been addressed prior to demonstration of their effective applications to humans. At times, expectations of their success have been disappointing. In the 1980s, for example, some bioethicists (myself among them) thought that neurological disorders such as Parkinson's might be treated effectively through transfer of fetal brain tissue; this has yet to occur.[1] At other times, researchers have achieved results previously considered impossible, such as the cloning of nonhuman animals. Stephen Wilkinson's new book addresses ethical and policy questions raised not only by the anticipated advances that may or may not materialize, but also by already-available developments in reproductive technology.

The range of options that reproductive technologies currently present has expanded considerably since the first report of successful in vitro fertilization (IVF) in 1978 in the United Kingdom. Today, IVF is widely accepted as a means by which infertile couples can have biologically-related children. When its use is extended beyond that limited context, however, ethical, social and policy questions arise. For example, the use of IVF to allow single individuals and gay couples to have children is challenged in some quarters. More controversial has been its use to permit third parties to contribute their gametes or to provide gestation so that others may have children. And yet more controversial is the use of IVF, in conjunction with other biotechnologies, to select among candidates for birth through prenatal or preimplantation testing to avoid disabilities or promote advantages in offspring. Choosing Tomorrow's Children targets the issues raised by this last set of uses.

Wilkinson is Professor of Bioethics and Director of the Centre for Professional Ethics at Keele University in Staffordshire, UK. Although the longest chapters in his book (on eugenics and sex selection) apparently draw on previous work, he here expands on his earlier arguments, critiques the positions and arguments of others, and lays out a coherent framework for analysis of multiple issues that coalesce around the topic of selective reproduction. Many of the cases used illustratively are taken from the public domain; others typify the hypothetical cases that analytic ethicists tend to employ in their arguments. Practitioners and patients have already been addressing some of the scenarios he envisions; others may never come to pass. The policies Wilkinson critiques are mainly those of the Human Fertilisation and Embryology Authority (HFEA), which was established in the UK in 1990. To readers from elsewhere, this may be disappointing. (Recently, the UK government decided to disband the HFEA, but the effectiveness and influence of its regulations are likely to continue through the distribution of its powers to other bodies.)

Wilkinson defines selective reproduction as "the attempt to create one possible future child rather than a different possible future child." (2) His analysis of the issues raised by such attempts involves a distinction between choices about "different possible children" and choices about "how many children to have." (3) His focus is on the former, in part because these issues are more controversial than the latter set of issues. As his title suggests, however, the ability to choose both number and kind of children is, for Wilkinson, an assumed value. Thus, in his introductory chapter, he acknowledges the "political liberalism" that underlies his "presumption of permissibility" on issues involving selective reproduction.

In the tradition of his philosophical training, Wilkinson's methodology is strictly analytic, i.e., an attempt to "analyse and critically assess arguments and to explicate concepts" without appeal to ethical theory or examination of the premises employed in the arguments. (15) Where he summons empirical data to support his premises, he forthrightly acknowledges that he himself is not equipped, nor does he attempt, to assess the strength of the data. Obviously, this leaves the reliability of his validly drawn conclusions subject to assessment by those who have the empirical expertise that he lacks.

Consistent with his analytic methodology, Wilkinson avoids consideration of an issue that is unavoidable in most of the controversial decisions about selective reproduction: the moral status of human embryos, whether in vitro or in vivo. His rationale for this avoidance is that "selective reproduction need not involve the selection and destruction of embryos." (13) It may instead be accomplished through sexual abstinence, contraception, gamete selection, and also through a method he doesn't mention -- mate selection. None of these measures, however, is reliably "selective." In contrast, the selection technologies to which Wilkinson prevalently refers in the cases he uses to develop his arguments are preimplantation genetic diagnosis and prenatal testing, both of which inevitably involve embryos or fetuses but are also diagnostically reliable.

Four types of selective reproduction are examined: selecting against disabilities or disease, selecting for specific anomalies, selecting for specific advantages, and sex selection (which, while apparently neutral, may also be considered an advantage or disadvantage). Wilkinson devotes the least space to selection against disease or disability because this type of selection has become widely practiced, even endorsed in some quarters, on grounds that potential parents ought to do what they can to avoid such problems in their offspring. Interestingly, that they are obligated to promote the well being of their offspring beyond that level is supportable as well, albeit less compellingly. However, regardless of whether potential parents are obliged to do what they can to enhance the lifetime prospects of their children, the majority of them strive to do more than merely avoid disability and disease in offspring, and such striving is broadly construed as commendable.

Three key concepts are carefully analyzed: commodification (of children), eugenics, and enhancement. Commodification involves the instrumentalization of an entity, using it as a means rather than an end. "Embryo selection," according to Wilkinson, "may well involve the instrumentalization of the embryos themselves, but this should not be troubling for people who do not think that embryos are persons or 'ends-in-themselves'." (147) He doubts that "there is really anything wrong with prospective parents having an entirely instrumentalist attitude to their possible, future offspring provided that this attitude does not spill over into the child's life." (138) His reasoning here applies not only to selection of "savior siblings" (embryos created and selected in order to treat a biological sibling) but also to those selected for desired anomalies (e.g., deafness, dwarfism) or for characteristics thought to confer social advantages.

Wilkinson's analysis of "eugenics" builds on Francis Galton's original formulation of the term as the science of improving the gene pool.[2] Depending on the means by which it is implemented, negative eugenics (efforts to eliminate disease or disability) is generally viewed as less problematic than positive eugenics (efforts to promote advantageous traits). Wilkinson, however, argues that the distinction between the two is simplistic and that the eugenic practice of embryo selection "to create healthier future populations" is not only acceptable but desirable. (166)

The analysis of eugenics is coupled with a critique of the so-called "expressivist argument." This argument critiques embryo selection to avoid disability in offspring on grounds that it conveys the message that "the world would be a better place" if persons already born with that disability did not exist. (183) Wilkinson's main objection to this argument is that such selection is a means by which prospective parents fulfill their obligation to promote "happiness" or "flourishing" in their offspring. The expressivist argument, he claims, is unsuccessful because it ignores this rationale for avoiding disabilities through embryo selection. He acknowledges, however, that some individuals who pursue embryo selection do so out of a discriminatory attitude towards people already born with disabilities.

"Enhancement," as Wilkinson recognizes, is similar to positive eugenics in that it involves efforts to promote better-than-normal traits. The term itself, he believes, may refer to improvement "that goes beyond, or is something other than, the avoidance of disease," or to improvement "beyond the normal range for persons." (188-9) Although he recognizes that what counts as disease may be problematic, he doesn't acknowledge that definitions of "normality" or "normal range" are also problematic. His conclusion about arguments against selection for enhancement of children is that they are "unsuccessful" except when their objective is to acquire "positional goods," that is, goods that provide "a competitive advantage over other people." (197)

Wilkinson defines many terms assiduously, but neglects analysis of others whose different interpretations could complicate or compromise his arguments, perhaps irremediably. His use of the notoriously controversial term "person" is restricted to humans already born, without considering whether some of these individuals (e.g., those who lack higher brain activity) are persons. As happens recurrently in the bioethics literature, terms such as "happiness," "flourishing," "disease," "normal," and "parent" are also left undefined. Of these, the term "normal" is particularly pertinent because its meaning stands at the threshold between "therapeutic" and "enhancing" reasons for selective reproduction. Restoring to "normality" from below the threshold is generally viewed positively, while going beyond that point to promote physical or social advantages is regarded negatively. Whether the range of "normality" is broad or narrow and what conditions count within the range has significant consequences for those on either side of the "norm."

Although Wilkinson's title does not specify whose choices he intends to consider, the book identifies the choices of "prospective parents" rather than "actual parents" as his main concern. (The obligations of actual parents are obviously more compelling than those of prospective parents.) Although he does not define "parent," he acknowledges that sperm or ova providers, as well as those who gestate for another individual or couple, may be considered prospective parents. However, even when the identity of prospective parents is not in question, cases in which they disagree about choices regarding selection of their progeny have been reported. Nor does Wilkinson consider the choices made by practitioners who perform the medical interventions required to selectively reproduce children. In light of the indispensable role these individuals play in selective reproduction, they may also be seen as choosing tomorrow's children. Thus, even if Wilkinson's "presumed permissibility" is compelling, the practical usefulness of his conclusions is limited by his failure to consider "whose" choices are more permissible than others.

Choosing Tomorrow's Children illustrates both the strengths and the weaknesses of the analytic tradition in philosophy. Bioethicists who work exclusively in that tradition are likely to praise the work because the author's analysis of terms and arguments is outstanding, and his own conclusions clearly follow from his premises. Philosophers who work in areas such as ethical theory, phenomenology and pragmatism are less likely to enthuse about the book, and bioethicists who are personally involved in the complexity of the clinic may like it least because the content is largely removed from that complexity. However, regardless of their philosophical or clinical background, those who agree with the conclusions that Wilkinson so carefully and elegantly develops must also agree with his starting assumption of political liberalism. In addition, they must either concur with him that decisions about selective reproduction are separable from positions about the moral status of embryos, or hold, with or without argument, that human embryos and fetuses have no moral status.

[1] Mary B. Mahowald, J. Areen, B.J. Hoffer et al., "Transplantation of Neural Tissue from Fetuses," Science 235 (1987): 1308-9; Paul E. Greene and Stanley Fahn, "Status of Fetal Tissue Transplantation for the Treatment of Advanced Parkinson Disease," Neurosurgery Focus 13, 5 (2002), accessed 10/11/10.

[2] Francis Galton, "Eugenics: Its Definition, Scope, and Aims," The American Journal of Sociology X, 1 (July 1904), accessed 10/11/10.