Cinema, Philosophy, Bergman: On Film as Philosophy

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Paisley Livingston, Cinema, Philosophy, Bergman: On Film as Philosophy, Oxford UP, 2009, 215pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199570171.

Reviewed by Murray Smith, University of Kent



Commentary on the philosophical dimensions of film and popular culture is now big business: every year sees the publication of dozens of works promising to reveal the ‘philosophy’ of films, television shows, and sundry cultural practices. Only yesterday I received an email from a prominent publisher, extolling the curative powers of such work which, I was assured, will ‘clear the cobwebs from Kant and the dust from Descartes.’ Although it is easy to be cynical about the motivations behind this trend, it is by no means an entirely bad thing: nothing should be beyond the bounds of philosophical reflection, and it would be a rather odd state of affairs if something as central in our lives as popular culture was simply ignored by philosophers.

Yet in spite of the torrent of material, there has been — ironically — rather little philosophical reflection on the basis for this wave of enthusiasm for PopPhi. Philosophers on the whole have been eager to dive into philosophical interpretations of films, casting aside the caution they might routinely exercise with regard to more traditional philosophical goals. The debate has been dominated by an ‘applied’ approach to the philosophy of popular culture, with very little attention to underlying questions about the nature of philosophical activity and the sense in which it can be sustained by films and other popular media. The field lacks, in other words, anything like a properly developed ‘metaphilosophy’ of film or popular culture. Paisley Livingston’s impressive book stands out against this background, by taking us through a detailed argument on the fundamental issues and drawing a very valuable map of the terrain. The book also reminds us that more is at stake than the latest HBO series, by using the work of the renowned Swedish film director, Ingmar Bergman, to explore the idea that a film might articulate significant philosophical ideas. While Bergman himself was a key exemplar of art rather than popular filmmaking, the arguments that Livingston builds around Bergman encompass the whole range of narrative cinema.

In Cinema, Philosophy, Bergman, Livingston brings together three strands of research for which he is well-known: his scholarship on Bergman (which extends back to Ingmar Bergman and the Rituals of Art, 1982), his work on intention (Art and Intention, 2005), and his concern with the relations between art and philosophy (e.g., Literature and Rationality, 1998). Throughout, Livingston supports various aspects of his arguments about authorship, and the expression of philosophical ideas in art works, by reference to statements from Bergman — who, it appears, not only sustained a long and fairly profilic career as a filmmaker, but continuously reflected on the nature of his work, publicly and privately (in unpublished notes, diaries, and the like).

Livingston’s compact and tightly-argued book is broken down into three parts, each comprised of two chapters. The first part, ‘Surveying Cinema as Philosophy,’ sets the scene by discussing the recent wave of interest in treating films not as objects of philosophical enquiry — a familiar enough practice within the philosophy of art — but as vehicles of philosophical enquiry. Livingston focuses on what he terms the ‘bold thesis’: the claim that films may make profound, original contributions to philosophical thinking, using means that are exclusive to film as a medium or art form. (Deleuzean-inspired claims concerning the ‘conceptual creativity’ of film are the most obvious target here, though there are certainly more analytically-minded philosophers, such as Tom Wartenberg and Stephen Mulhall, who have made similarly strong claims about individual films, or the potential of cinema more generally.) While a seductive proposal, Livingston argues that this very strong version of the ‘film-as-philosophy’ claim is critically undermined by a dilemma that arises from it. If a film is to live up to the exclusivity requirement, then the philosophical content of the work cannot be paraphrased, and doubts may be raised about the existence of this purported philosophical contribution. On the other hand, if it is granted that the philosophical content of a work can be verbally rendered, and a paraphrase is offered as evidence of that content, then the exclusivity requirement has been surrendered. Attempts to solve the dilemma by allowing for a very broad conception of the means exclusive to cinema — allowing, for example, that an expressively-inert filmic recording of a philosopher delivering a lecture counts as an instance of exclusive cinematic form — simply trivialize the claim, turning the ‘bold’ thesis into a ‘tepid’ one (22).

Livingston’s solution is deflationary in spirit: he urges that we relax both the exclusivity and originality conditions, trading (in the final words of the book) extravagant ‘pronouncements about the cinema’s world-historical philosophical significance’ (200) for more modest, careful and specific arguments. The second two parts of the book seek to deliver on that promise, via the case study on Bergman, but prior to that Livingston rounds out part one by considering objections that might be raised even against more modest conceptions of film-as-philosophy. He focuses on two such objections. The ‘propriety’ objection complains that to treat a work of film art as a vehicle of philosophy is to misunderstand the nature of artistic value: in the words of Hegel, whom Livingston quotes in launching this section, art does not (or at least should not) serve the external ends of ‘instruction, moral improvement, or political agitation’ (39). Livingston finds that this is an untenably restrictive conception of artistic value, favouring a more pluralistic conception in which epistemic value is one type of value that an artwork might possess; philosophical value would then be a specific type of epistemic or cognitive value. The ‘rationality’ objection, which Livingston regards as the more substantial of the two worries, holds that if our aim is to engage in philosophical activity, making a film is a poor (not only sub-optimal, but ‘sub-satisfictual’) choice, as a film will invariably be either a less effective, or a less ‘complete,’ way of articulating some particular philosophical content than a verbal expression. Livingston’s response here comes via a simple but striking analogy. If you need to tighten a screw and a screwdriver is to hand, it is irrational to persevere with a coin (with which one will complete the job more laboriously, more slowly, and less effectively). But there may be situations where this is a false dichotomy — where recourse to the screwdriver and the coin is at least as effective as the screwdriver alone:

What must be rejected … is the idea that we must make a choice between doing philosophy with film and doing philosophy with the linguistic and conceptual tools with which philosophy has been done prior to the advent of the cinema (56).

Part two, ‘An Intentionalist Approach to Film as Philosophy,’ picks up and develops a thread of argument that part one already began to establish: that a film can hardly be the locus of determinate meaning, let alone advanced philosophical thinking, unless it is understood in the context of what we take to be its maker’s intentions. Livingston advances a position he labels partial intentionalism. He clears the ground first by indicating that the notion of authorship he will defend is classificatory rather than evaluative or honorific (authors can be good, bad, or mediocre). Artistic authorship obtains where an agent expresses some attitude or state of mind through a work, and does so with ‘sufficient control’ over the process (control being a matter of degree). Livingston also grants that while some artistic authorship is not best construed as expressive (of beliefs and other attitudes), expressive authorship nevertheless captures a very wide range of cases, including the central case at stake here: films embodying philosophical activity (71, 99). Along with individual authorship, various types of joint authorship — characterized by the successful ‘meshing’ of ‘sub-plans’ (74) of the authorial agents involved — are possible, and indeed common in the case of film. Bergman, however, typically acted as an individual author, notwithstanding the evident skill of his creative collaborators. Livingston is firm on this point: focusing on a striking moment of performance by Harriet Andersson in Summer with Monika (1953), Livingston insists that, while the actress certainly makes a highly-skilful creative contribution at this moment and across the film, she is not an author ‘because she did not play the right sort of controlling and expressive roles in the making of the work’ (79). She gives expression to the attitudes of the character, but that character is part of an overall expressive design of which Bergman is the (sole) author.

With this conception of authorship in place, Livingston then tackles the problems and questions associated with Wimsatt and Beardsley’s ‘intentional fallacy.’ On what grounds should we restrict, or weight, our interpretative goals towards the discovery of the intended meaning of a work? No amount of philosophizing can eradicate the unruly sense-making activity of spectators. Livingston holds, though, that we can judge the different sorts of grounds, and relative strength of, different interpretations, and we can seek to establish the norms by which interpretation ought, ideally, to abide. Livingston concedes that the semantic properties of a work are not wholly a matter of those actually intended by that work’s author(s), if only because a work may possess expressive content arising from its design, understood in context, but unintended by its author(s). (If one utters the question ‘¿tiene huevos?’ while visiting Mexico, intended as a request for eggs, one is apt to be misunderstood as offering a provocative remark on the manhood of one’s interlocutor.) He grants that a distinction between utterer’s meaning and utterance meaning is warranted, where the former is the meaning intended by the author of a work, while the latter ‘emerges in a relation between utterer’s meaning, conventional or linguistic meaning, and contextual factors’ (95).

Livingston is caustic, however, about looser-limbed varieties of intentionalism — hypothetical, fictionalist, conditionalist — which ‘warrant any number of incompatible readings and so do not sufficiently determine a coherent result’ (90). In place of such slack strategies, Livingston advocates ‘the meshing condition.’ Although Livingston sometimes presents this simply as a way of capturing the meaning of a work (100), it is more aptly described as a measure of the gap between utterer’s and utterance meaning. The interpreter judges the degree to which a work successfully realizes certain intentions by exploring the degree of convergence (or ‘meshing’) between those intentions and the rhetorical structure of the work itself. Such an approach, he contends, may illuminate both successful cases, where there is strong meshing between intention and work (Day of Wrath, 1943), and less successful cases, where it is evident that the work itself does not entirely realize the stated aims of its author (Twelve Angry Men, 1957). Here Livingston makes good on the promise that his intentionalism is ‘partial.’

In part three, Livingston concretizes and further explores the arguments regarding film-as-philosophy, and intentionalism, via a study of the works of Bergman. Bergman is a fitting case study, given his established reputation as a distinctive author whose works are often regarded as having a philosophical dimension. The cornerstone of Livingston’s argument here, and the feature that makes it most original as an interpretation of Bergman’s oeuvre, is that Bergman’s films were systematically informed by — and ‘mesh powerfully’ (127) with — the philosophy of the Finnish positivist, Eino Kaila. Bergman was quite explicit about the influence on him of Kaila’s treatise in philosophical psychology, Psychology of the Personality (1934). But, Livingston argues, the relative obscurity of Kaila outside of Scandinavia, and the fact his Psychology has only ever been translated into Danish and Swedish, has led Bergman scholars to neglect the Kaila connection, preferring to interpret Bergman’s films in the light of more canonical philosophers such as Kierkegaard, and the existentialist movement more generally, as well as psychoanalysis. (Livingston resists few opportunities to swipe at psychoanalysis, but he acknowledges that, on his theory, there will be cases where a psychoanalytic interpretation is warranted. Bertolucci is one such case, since the audio-visual rhetoric of his films meshes so perfectly with his stated intention to employ a psychoanalytic dramaturgy.) Drawing on a wide range of Bergman’s films, Livingston presents a kind of consilience of inductions supporting the hypothesis that Bergman was engaged, in part, in a philosophical dialogue with Kaila. The density of these interconnections, on Livingston’s theory, trumps those alternative interpretations linking Bergman with other philosophers and philosophical traditions.

Kaila’s psychology emphasizes the distorting influence of motivational forces on reason and belief. Human psychology is governed above all by desire or need (Finnish tarve), to the extent that ‘thought is generally a matter of wishful thinking’ (130). Given the difficulties in realizing many desires, humans are prone to seek the satisfaction of desire through surrogate objects, sometimes in ritualized form. Livingston finds abundant evidence in Bergman’s work of dramatic and rhetorical structures answering to this picture of human psychology. An extended analysis of From the Life of the Marionettes (1980), for example, shows how the film’s characterizations and other structures conform to Kaila’s theory of motivated irrationality (rather than the psychoanalytic theory also given voice, but undercut, in the film).

Yet Bergman’s films are not mere illustrations of Kailain theses: Bergman absorbs ideas from Kaila, but goes beyond them. In this way, Livingston contends that Bergman’s films really do hold up as an instance of ‘philosophy in action.’ The films act as an expressive vehicle for Bergman’s philosophical thinking, which takes the form of a critical engagement with Kaila. Livingston shows how Persona (1966) dramatizes, in the figure of nurse Alma, the kind of self-deception identified by Kaila: Alma so keenly desires a relationship of intimacy and mutual respect with the actress in her care, Elisabet, that she fails to see or to consider factors which undermine that vision. But Alma is able to overcome, to an extent, this self-deception, achieving a more authentic self-understanding. It is in the relationship between this possibility for hard-won, partial self-knowledge and morality that Livingston sees Bergman decisively going beyond Kaila. Kaila’s positivism is manifest in an avowed anti-realism towards values (there are only desires — no duties or obligations), but as an artist squarely in the modernist tradition, Bergman is committed to the recognition and ‘unflinching exploration’ (188) of human irrationality and cruelty, as opposed to the consolations of fantasy. Far from embodying scepticism or nihilism, Bergman’s works seem to depend on our acceptance of the ‘sway of value’ (193), epistemic and moral: truth matters, and evil exists.

Livingston’s book covers an impressive amount territory in an exceptionally clear, and often lively, fashion. He is rigorous and yet generous with argumentative opponents. The book balances abstract, conceptual argument with the close analysis of particular films and sequences very effectively; Livingston carries the ‘heavy evidentiary burden’ (199) of his intentionalist approach to Bergman’s works with grace. Inevitably, of course, some puzzles and questions remain. I will consider three of them briefly here.

Livingston describes his interpretative approach as requiring ‘reciprocal adjustment [between internal and external evidence] leading ideally to a reflexive equilibrium’ (108). While he makes a powerful case for the significance of external evidence of authorial intention, I wonder about the symmetry that is implicit in this statement. Is it not the case that the internal evidence provided by the text — the audio-visual design of a film — always holds a certain priority in the interpretative process? Here is one way to grasp this point. Throughout the book, Livingston draws on material cut out from the final, released versions of Bergman’s films, in order to further illuminate the meaning of the final work. But Livingston uses this material in both directions: where material that resonates with the interpretation of the work that Livingston defends is cut, the cut is explained by other factors (the need to maintain a certain rhythm in the film, or not to overburden a scene with too much speech). When Bergman removes or changes material that cuts against the grain of Livingston’s interpretation, he treats this as confirmation of that interpretation. Now this would appear to raise a ‘falsification’ worry: material cut from the final film can always be drafted to support a given interpretation, whether it coheres with it or contradicts it (just as the psychoanalyst can tell us that we are repressing some putative fact about our psychic life if we do not readily acknowledge it). One important way around this worry is to grant that it is the audio-visual design of the film that determines how we are to interpret material which has been cut; that is, interpretation should be based on what we can most reasonably infer about the reasons for its removal. This, in fact, is just how Livingston proceeds, but it grants the internal evidence of the audio-visual design a priority over external evidence of intention that he is reluctant to acknowledge fully.

Another reason for granting the priority of internal, textual evidence has to do with the various ways in which our access to authorial intention on the basis of external evidence is fallible and limited. There are at least three distinct types of limitation. Most obviously, there are contingencies of access to the extra-textual evidence of intention: notes, sketches, storyboards and other such preparatory materials may be lost, destroyed, or locked up, and many intentions may never be embodied in material form at all. Second, not all intentions are conscious; it is plausible to suppose that an artist may embed, say, certain parallels or repetitions in a work without consciously recognizing that they are doing so, or being able to report on their reasons for doing so. Relatedly, where there is no independent record of an intention, the limitations of memory make it possible that an artist will forget or misremember what they intended. In all these cases, the work itself is the best evidence that the author — let alone the interpreter — can have for the intentions that lay behind its creation. Third, artists may have systematic reasons for wishing to conceal or even dissemble in relation to their real intentions; indeed Livingston notes that Bergman took this view himself, believing that by giving away ‘the answers … some of the suggestiveness, excitement, and joy involved in experiencing a film’ (128) is lost. On this view, the artist has a kind of duty of silence (an elevated version of the practice of avoiding ‘spoilers’ in film reviews, perhaps). Other artists may pursue a different solution, actively building up a ‘biographical legend’ that shapes the context in which a work is received — effectively acting as an extension of the work itself — but providing no reliable picture of the artist’s actual intentions (think of the gnomic David Lynch, or the trickster Coen brothers). So there is no guarantee of transparent access to intentions even where we have prima facie extra-textual evidence of them. And because these factors underline the extent of our reliance on the evidence afforded by the work itself, taken together they push us towards a kind of hypothetical intentionalism, which stresses the hypothetical and provisional nature of our interpretations of art works, even as it retains the idea that interpretation is largely driven by the attempt to track actual intentions.

A second lingering question concerns what Livingston identifies as the problem of individuating philosophical traditions (127). Livingston sets his argument that the philosophical dimension of Bergman’s oeuvre is best illuminated by reference to Kaila against numerous other attempts to read Bergman in the light of existentialism. Livingston expresses what I take to be an empiricist scepticism towards this loose and abstract category, favouring the concreteness and specificity of a particular philosopher’s work which, by his own account, Bergman found to be enormously compelling. But while Livingston wins the battle concerning the significance of Kaila, he does not here win the larger war, for several reasons. We learn in his exposition of Kaila that the concept of ‘authenticity’ was an important one for Kaila (and we have had a glimpse, in the comments on Persona above, of its significance for Livingston’s interpretation of Bergman’s films). If, however, authenticity plays a central role in Kaila’s work, perhaps Kaila should be regarded as a contributor to, or fellow traveller of, the broader tradition of existentialism. Livingston is in no position to block this sort of possibility, since he draws on it himself. He notes that Kaila and Bergman ‘drew on common, anterior sources’ (136), including Nietzsche.

If the significance of the connection between Kaila and Bergman can be underlined by noting how both figures emerge from the same cultural context, or take their cue from shared cultural sources, why can the same not be said about Bergman and other philosophers whose work would have been part of his cultural milieu? More tellingly still, Livingston is quite happy to situate Bergman within the category of ‘modernism,’ as we have seen. But ‘modernism’ is a very broad and rather abstract critical category used to encompass a wide range of artists working in different contexts, at different moments, each with their own more immediate agendas. If the sceptical razor is to be taken to loose talk about ‘existentialism,’ ‘modernism’ ought to be cut down as well. In my own view, critical terms at various levels of abstraction can be justified; a conceptual landscape restricted to the level of individual agents would be highly impoverished, and could hardly account for the diverse ways in which cultural and philosophical ideas are transmitted. Moreover, it is not obvious that arguing for the relevance of both Kaila and a looser tradition of ‘existentialism’ are mutually exclusive goals.

Finally, let us return to Livingston’s fable of the coin and the screwdriver. Livingston defends the rationality of interpreting Bergman’s films philosophically — and, by extension, the rationality of Bergman using film as a vehicle for philosophical expression — by suggesting that there are occasions when the conjoined use of the screwdriver (verbal argument) and the coin (film) may be rationally justified. But I wonder if a stronger version of this claim is available to Livingston. On his account, it would always be at least as rational to advance a philosophical claim purely through traditional, verbal means. This doesn’t provide the most robust defense of an artist like Bergman: why bother with all those financial backers, actors, and other collaborators? Wouldn’t the philosophical results have been at least as good, and more easily achieved, by writing a few philosophical papers? In order to defend a stronger thesis, we should ask: are there not contexts in which it is actually more rational to choose the coin over the screwdriver?

If there is such a context, it is the domain of moral philosophy, especially as it is understood by a certain strand of contemporary moral particularists. Iris Murdoch, Cora Diamond, Martha Nussbaum and others have argued that literature plays a crucial role in moral thought: to pursue our metaphor, if you want to ‘drive home’ a moral point, you will do it more effectively with a work of literary art than with a traditional philosophical argument. We are most alive to moral considerations when we are engaged — perceptually, emotionally, and imaginatively — in the contemplation of particular situations, and it is literature, and narrative art more generally, that engages us in this way. Livingston steers close to this position when he notes that film may be better-suited to the exploration of agency and value than to other philosophical topics (37). The tricky question here, of course, is whether the type of moral encounter celebrated by these philosophers — the value of which I do not doubt — is to count as a kind of moral philosophy, or whether it is more aptly regarded as an extension of ordinary moral experience. This argument is, nevertheless, a position open to Livingston, and one which meshes readily with his estimation of Bergman’s artistic and philosophical achievement.