Civil Disagreement: Personal Integrity in a Pluralistic Society

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Edward Langerak, Civil Disagreement: Personal Integrity in a Pluralistic Society, Georgetown University Press, 2014, 170pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781626160330.

Reviewed by Mark Kingwell, University of Toronto


Laments about the decline of civility are the currency of the age. Look at the social-media meltdowns, the incendiary political talk shows, or the insult-swapping norms of comments boards. Observe the growing intransigence of partisan bickering at the highest levels of government, where elected representatives go on record as intending to strangle across-the-floor efforts in the name of ideological purity. Consider the creeping isolation of districts and neighbourhoods -- not to mention publications, workplaces, eating venues, and shopping sites -- which enbubble citizens among the like-minded so that they need never encounter a disagreeing citizen (or, in some cases, an impoverished one) except in theory, at a distance, on a screen.

All true, all significant. Such conventional laments are invariably met with a conventional retort, namely that there is nothing new under the sun. Socrates complained about the ill manners of Athenian youth, their lack of respect and tendency to take all the good food at parties. American politics in the 1930s, or the 1880s, or the 1830s, or whenever, was nastier and more uncivil than today's sanitized, robotic, at-a-distance bickering. Likewise all true, and there the matter is usually allowed to rest, in a sort of point-counterpoint stalemate that resembles, at a meta-level, the very same disagree-to-differ stalemates of the daily political discourse. The trouble is this: things have indeed changed in political discourse, and allowing the second-order arguments concerning civility to devolve into it-was-ever-thus complacency is a dangerous error. The laments for declining civility are not reducible to nostalgia for non-existent golden ages of sweet reason, nor are all signs of mounting self-regard and lack of consideration for others the inevitable crankiness of middle-aged Weltschmerz. That is to say, we must examine these issues at a structural level, not merely in the narrow terms of journalistic inquiry: "Does Twitter make people rude?" Yes, sometimes, probably. But that's not all that Twitter does, and it's not the important point to debate in any event. Sometimes the medium is not the message.

So what is? Before I suggest an answer, let me enumerate the virtues of Edward Langerak's energetic, nuanced new book on the political virtue of civility. His central concern is this important issue: can one maintain a strong sense of personal integrity, necessarily including elements of firm ethical conviction, in a pluralistic society? By pluralism Langerak means not simply the fact of divergent views on core questions of how to live and what to value, but the essential liberal view that such divergence is to be embraced, not merely tolerated or, worse, allowed to be the cause of simmering anger or prejudice. How do we agree to disagree in a manner that is not threatening to our sense of ethical coherence?

Langerak works out his answer to this question, which he labels "perspective pluralism," in a series of closely argued chapters, each careful to draw the distinctions necessary for a valid conclusion. Arguments must be distinguished from other forms of discourse that have argumentative trappings, or a show of claim and counter-claim. Even within arguments, we must distinguish among the possible ends of the activity. "Argument will not be reduced to fighting as long as we keep some important distinctions in mind," he writes. "Arguments and debates can be used in at least three ways: to defeat others, to persuade others, and to inquire with others" (18). Though the schematic is accurate enough, the optimism of the premise sentence in this claim is worth remarking: keeping the distinctions "in mind" seems rather thin weaponry against the formidable reductionism of human discourse, even among those who (a) agree that they are arguing and (b) agree on what counts as a valid argument. Anyone who has engaged in even a stringent rational exchange -- say, one between two trained philosophers with considerable rational agreement in back of, and underwriting, their on-the-table disagreement -- will know that human discourse is muddy terrain. Non-rational elements such as resentment, envy, professional posturing, status anxiety, power relations, past history, gender roles, and physical presence all can, and do, seep into such exchanges. The sense of argument as shared inquiry may remain our ideal of human linguistic ability in action, the warm Socratic project, but it is an ideal with very few actual instantiations.

Civility, he suggests in common with many other philosophers who address the topic of ethical pluralism, is not simply an appearance of acceptance, a matter of manners which mask disapproval. It is a sincere and reasonable stance that attempts to understand why a fellow citizen might hold views widely different from my own, and with the same sort of conviction with which I maintain mine. Langerak endorses a careful skepticism concerning final (i.e., discourse-trumping) answers to deep ethical questions even as he fights shy of general relativism or non-cognitivism about value claims. Above all he is concerned with how we comport ourselves when confronted by the (reasonable) other, bringing to bear our stores of respect and willingness to listen and consider without abandoning our own considered ethical judgments. "[T]he civility of national debates could be greatly enhanced without reducing the strength of advocacy if people would explicitly recognize that others can be thought wrong without being thought unreasonable," Langerak writes in a typical sentence. "We should recognize that principled intolerance can be combined with principled respect, not only for one's opponents as persons, but for their positions as well" (96). Intolerance here is used in the narrow sense of 'not accepting as true'.

There are, to be sure, limits on the discursive demand for civility and respect. Langerak notes that

reasonable pluralism is not the same as sheer diversity. Paranoia may be reasonable to paranoid people without being reasonable for them. That many conflicting outlooks can simultaneously be regarded as reasonable does not imply that all outlooks, including those due to sheer prejudice or stubborn ignorance, must be regarded as reasonable. (52)

The fact that one holds a view, and even considers oneself justified to hold it, is not yet evidence that one is justified in holding it -- though here one is tempted to respond with the well-known riposte about the paranoiac, namely, just because you're paranoid doesn't mean they're not out to get you. A footnote on the passage offers an arguably better version of the point by reversing the for/to polarity: "I may have a deep desire for health but deny the obvious fact that exercise will promote it. Then, in an important sense, I have a reason to exercise, but I cannot give the reason; a policy is justified for me, but not to me" (71n43).

Even with this subtle but necessary shift in assessment -- the nice distinction between agreeing that something might be justified to you versus agreeing that it is justified for you -- a good deal hangs on what 'reasonable' is taken to mean. The crux here is what counts as a public reason, which is to say one that others would recognize as a valid reason for holding a view, even if those others neither hold the view in question nor, indeed, would themselves validate the given reason. Matters are further complicated by the fact that a given position might be bolstered by reasons one could accept as public, yet these are not the reasons that lead you to hold the position. Is the position then (as held by you) reasonable or not? Not surprisingly, the larger analysis owes a good deal to Rawls's discussion of reasonable versus rational in Political Liberalism (1991), and the resulting account of what he called "the burdens of judgment": the most common features of shared political life that are likely to generate disagreement, such as ambiguities in conceptual meaning and disputes over empirical evidence.

So this is a book written in the spirit of Rawlsian political liberalism; but Langerak is also widely, even magisterially, conversant with the larger literature on the subject of political disagreement. He rejects several tempting options in pursuit of his conclusion: robust deliberative democracy, Habermasian consensus theory, a virtue-based or strongly republican account of citizenship, and so on. Everywhere he is at pains to make apparently small theoretical differences plain in their import. He concludes -- correctly -- that disagreement is a fact of political life which must be taken seriously, managed where it cannot be resolved, and moreover that this taking seriously is a responsibility of every citizen. He endorses a version of the so-called restraint principle, framed as a positive discursive duty: "conscientious citizens ought to restrain themselves from using nonpublic reasons to advocate or vote for coercive legislation unless they are also willing and able to provide public reasons for it" (113). This principle is reciprocal and, provided it is not entirely stipulative or question-begging (i.e., simply identifying the set of reasonable persons with the set of those who agree to exercise the restraint principle), the duty can be viewed as having purchase.

There are problems in Langerak's approach, however. By relegating the detailed engagements with the relevant literature to footnotes, he has kept the main text clean but somewhat puzzling. That is, in the body of the book we are told about various theoretical disagreements, some quite fine-spun, and then asked to accept an adjudication between them. Unless one is familiar with the literature, however, or takes time to digest the associated footnotes, the motivation for a given decision is not always clear. The book functions as a kind of roadmap to the terrain, but rather in the way that the sometimes imperious dashboard-GPS voice simply tells us, "Up ahead, you will turn left" or, when we fail to heed, "Recalculating . . . recalculating."

To be sure, this may not count as a serious flaw: a book makes its points in whatever manner the author deems best. More seriously, at least to a non-American reader, the examples of serious political disagreement seem a trifle intramural and too much burdened with a concern for religious conviction. Gay marriage and abortion rights for women, to mention two, are no longer matters of serious division in most Western countries. I don't mean to suggest that they are not important tests of civility among citizens, just that they belong to a political culture that is still far too influenced by Christian ideology to be recognizable outside the range of Fox News and CNN.

Still, there is good reason to see this not as a serious flaw but simply a matter of application. Langerak's account of civility as willing restraint of disapproval in the interests of the polity may be transferable to other political contexts, where the deep disagreements are, say, those between the trusteeship value indigenous peoples and their allies put on the natural world versus the profit motive and instrumental reasoning that guide those in pursuit of resource 'development'. A still more serious worry lurks, and this one belongs to the same American political culture out of which this book arises. I mean the structural issues that may render moot its rational-liberal premises about citizens, views, reasonableness, integrity, and even political discourse itself.

Consider two singular moments in recent American political history, one an apparently minor but telling remark from a functionary in the George W. Bush administration, the other a landmark U.S. Supreme Court decision whose influence is still not entirely understood.

In October of 2004, New York Times Magazine journalist Ron Suskind quoted a then-unnamed source from Bush's inner circle who dismissed those still mired "in what we call the reality-based community," defined as people who "believe that solutions emerge from your judicious study of discernible reality." He continued:

We're an empire now, and when we act, we create our own reality. And while you're studying that reality -- judiciously, as you will -- we'll act again, creating other new realities, which you can study too, and that's how things will sort out. We're history's actors . . . and you, all of you, will be left to just study what we do.

The quotation was later attributed to Karl Rove, who was then a senior political advisor to Bush and became White House deputy chief of staff the following February, serving in that office until August 2007.

One might be tempted to dismiss this statement as typical Rovean bluster, and indeed the defeat of the Republicans in the 2008 presidential election gave many people hope that the imperial "Mission Accomplished" posturing of the Bush administration was a thing of the past, an aberration. But I tend to credit Rove with a deeper insight here, namely that his diagnosis is correct, even in the absence of an American imperial mission. Rove understood, in other words, that the new millennium had generated new norms of political discourse and behaviour. The old pieties of Enlightenment thought, including the essential premises that there is such a thing as 'reality' penetrable by reason, and that such penetration has the power to alter behaviour, were in the dustbin of history. In their place was something we might call postmodern right-wing realpolitik, the conviction that power ('action' in Rove's formulation) creates its own rules and (temporary) realities. Those of us still trapped in the norms and methods of the 'reality-based community' can now only stand by and watch, no doubt wringing our hands all the while. Our sharp tools of the mind, the honed chisels of evidence and logic, are just so many parlour tricks -- and worse, ones whose unexamined exercise results only in pulling the wool over our own eyes.

The landmark court decision is of course Citizens United v. Federal Election Commission, decided in January 2010. In it, the Court held that restrictions on independent corporate expenditures in political campaigns, as opposed to direct political contributions, are unconstitutional restrictions on the freedom of speech. This decision at once inhibits democracy by quantifying (and then hiking) the opportunity costs of participation, even as it reduces the idea of such participation to money itself. To be sure, corporations have been granted some of the rights of citizens in American law for some decades. But Citizens United does more than extend such rights. By means of a spectral metaphysics of plutocracy, it effectively delivers the electoral process over to the moneyed interests whose pools of capital are now instantly transformed into pools of influence.

These two artifacts of recent political history might seem unrelated, and yet, in the context of Langerak's views on pluralism, civility, and integrity, they are not only related but matters of the utmost urgency. Alasdair MacIntyre, in After Virtue (2nd ed. 1984) -- a book Langerak engages at some length, though ultimately finds wanting in its account of Enlightenment rationality -- argued that a virtue ethic required not just an enumeration of desirable character traits, or dispositions to act, but also, crucially, two other features: first, a sense of a role that one could legitimately play, a virtuous identity, such as the Aristotelian phronimos, the Augustan gentleman, or the thrifty New Englander; second, there must be a suitable background context for the exercise of the enumerated virtues, a set of shared assumptions that would assure the reinforcement cycle between action and character.

The presumption of virtually all philosophical argument concerning civility, whether one takes an explicitly virtue-style account or not, is precisely that there is such a context: public reason, courts of reasonable appeal, individuals with preferences to articulate, and so on. But what if the context is in fact one where these presumptions are maintained only as fictions, where the real influence and even the notion of speech has been stealthily -- and not so stealthily! -- removed from the hands of individual citizens and placed, instead, in spectral agencies or pools of power in the form of money?

Philosophers cannot go on, it seems to me, without addressing these practical realities of civic life. Defenders of civility may need to abandon the optative, restraint-based accounts that have hitherto dominated, and seek instead routes of argument that include analysis of systematic discursive distortions, once thought (by Habermas, for example) to be the exclusive preserves of ideology or madness. Perhaps the sad conclusion of our own moment is that what was once considered a declension from the norm -- the norm being rational discourse of a more or less well-intentioned sort -- is now the new normal, namely of presumptively ideological speech that all too often resembles the sort of madness that cannot be reasoned with. If this is so, or even partially accurate, then new lines of argument may be necessary, for example, ones that operate negatively, attempting to show not why civility is a good thing but, rather, why incivility is self-defeating. This sort of collective action problem argument will no doubt appear cynical to those of a more ideal persuasion; and they may risk a certain kind of self-envelopment, giving away the stakes in search of victory, as for example when we attempt to defend the value of humanistic education with reference to its ability to secure law-school admission or a higher median income at forty years of age.

These are, I think, judgments and risks that will have to be shouldered in pursuit of overall democratic values. And of course further options will no doubt emerge as a new generation of philosophers tackles this most central problem of political life. For we still need ways to defend individual integrity, the value of choice and preference, and the idea of public reason. Langerak's book, the culmination of a long career of sensitive thinking and teaching on this subject, might be regarded as the last of its breed. From now on, the champions of civility and integrity in political life are going to need a new game plan.