Civil Disobedience and the Politics of Identity: When We Should Not Get Along

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Jason D. Hill, Civil Disobedience and the Politics of Identity: When We Should Not Get Along, Palgrave MacMillan, 2013, 201pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137330635.

Reviewed by Douglas Ficek, John Jay College of Criminal Justice


Jason D. Hill is a liberal -- an unapologetic, fiercely confrontational liberal. He affirms individual rights, and he denies virtually all attempts to subordinate individual rights in the name of something larger. This is especially true with respect to racial and ethnic groups, which, according to him, too often function as supreme arbiters, telling people, as individuals, what they can and can't think, what they can and can't do. As Hill explains in the text, which is part memoir, such attempts at subordination produce "an ethos . . . that gives rise to cultural apartheid" (xvi), an ethos that affects him personally, not only as a Jamaican immigrant with brown skin, but also -- and more importantly -- as a self-described "secular humanist" (13) and "cosmopolitan social democrat." (ix). Interestingly, he does not blame white racism -- past or present, individual or institutional -- for this so-called "cultural apartheid." Indeed, he explicitly says that racism is not to blame. Rather, he blames multiculturalism, which is, according to him, dehumanizing in theory and in practice. He blames the "radical multicultural left" (122), which is, he candidly warns, allowing illiberal peoples -- Muslims, in particular -- to wreak havoc in the liberal democracies of the demonstrably superior Western world.

Hill's thesis is fairly straightforward: Liberal democracies are and should be tolerant, but they should not tolerate illiberal peoples and their practices in the name of pluralism or multiculturalism, both of which are guilty of crude essentialism and axiological relativism -- and thus nihilism. This is not an Aristotelian position per se, but it could be argued that Hill's book represents an attempt to delimit tolerance as a liberal virtue, to make the argument that excessive tolerance is a vice inasmuch as it allows people who are tolerance-deficient to exploit, oppress, and dehumanize others -- not as groups, but as individuals. As he explains in the preface:

This is a book about when getting along is often a collusion with evil and a great blemish on individual and national conscience. To judge a wrong to be egregious and to be willing to undermine social cohesion in a society for its amelioration . . . is to function as a sovereign moral agent. It is to work on behalf of humanity's moral improvement. (xiii)

And who are the intolerable peoples whom Hill has chosen to write about? There are three groups: opponents of gay marriage, proponents of the burka, and immigrants who privilege racial and/or ethnic membership over and above the principled individualism of political liberalism. These three groups, according to him, should be called out, should be harshly criticized; we should not get along with them, and liberal democracies should not tolerate their "logic of contagion,"[1] an essentialistic logic that is literally "destroying Western civilization from within" (6). Universalism should be our normative goal, Hill contends, and the radical particularism espoused by these groups -- a particularism that finds ample support among the multiculturalist intelligentsia -- obstructs that goal and thus the idea of a unified human world.

In chapter two, which is titled "Leave My Genitals Alone: Same-Sex Marriage and the Nature of Moral Values," Hill criticizes the illiberal opponents of gay marriage, who are not only "inappropriate" (33), but also "cruel and unusual" (37). He argues that marriage is secured by our basic right to life, and that opposition to gay marriage is less about religion -- although religion most definitely contributes to it[2] -- and more about homosexual obsessive compulsive disorder (HOCD). "The eroticization of gay genitals in sex," he writes,

turns on a form of homosexual anxiety. Since HOCD is a form of obsessive compulsive disorder (OCD), the mental images of gays having sex that plague [gay marriage opponents] is offset by a form of magical thinking: if we deny gays the right to marry, then they can't be members of our in-groups, and our obsession with what they do anally and genitally will dissipate. (43)

Hill categorically rejects any attempt to delimit individual rights that is premised upon mental illness -- "social malarkey" (43) is the term he uses to describe such a thing -- and he concludes the chapter with a call to critique the distinctly heterosexual norms that have, for too long, framed the marriage debate. "Rather than ape the conventional modules of heterosexual marriage (one man one woman)," he declares, "homosexuals could be the purveyors for a new sexual morality in which couplehood is called into question as the single model around which marriage is organized and as the only metric used to judge the efficacy of marital relationships" (48).

In chapter three, "Hiding from Humanity: The Burka, the Face and the Annihilation of Humanity," Hill addresses the controversy surrounding the burka -- specifically, the controversy surrounding the French "burqa ban"[3] that took effect in April 2011. He argues that the burka is a "misanthropic hate symbol . . . that reduces a woman to nothing but her sex" (xiii), and that the French ban is thus a legitimate expression -- and defense -- of liberal values and institutions. Interestingly, he makes this argument by way of Levinas, whose phenomenologically-informed analysis of the face is used to criticize the enforced facelessness of so many Muslim women around the world. As Hill explains:

We recognize people by seeing their faces and we acknowledge their humanity by reading what their faces tell us. Humans cannot come alive to each other without this information. A woman wearing a mask is a woman declining to be a human being. Unable to look anyone in the eye, lacking peripheral vision, her hearing muffled, she becomes an abstraction. But the situation is much worse. It deliberately leaves human beings vulnerable in the public sphere. Reading the face of others is a way of gauging the level of security we feel in their presence. In not being able to see the face of the Other we would have a national security risk on our hands. Looking into the face of the Other tells us whether another person is a threat to us. (64-65, emphasis added)

To be clear, Hill cares about Muslim women and the "gender apartheid" (4) that so many of them suffer, but his primary concern -- and he is very explicit about this -- is Western civilization and its long-term survival. Like Samuel P. Huntington, he looks at the contemporary, post 9/11 world and sees a dangerous clash of civilizations.[4]

Finally, in chapter three, which is titled "Anti-Assimilationism, Xenophobia, Misanthropy and the Logic of Contagion," Hill criticizes the "people in our society who do not want to be like the rest of us" (87), by which he means the immigrants -- Muslims, especially -- who privilege racial and/or ethnic membership over and above the principled individualism of political liberalism. He rejects the opposing, more-or-less equal forces of xenophobia and anti-assimilationism, and he focuses on the "logic of contagion" that undergirds them both. Not surprisingly, his argument against this logic mirrors the arguments against essentialism that have pervaded philosophy for decades.[5] "The assimilaphobe," he writes, coining a new term,

is not just concerned with cultivating a special kind of culturally authentic life for himself. The personal autonomy of his group members get sacrificed to a script -- his script which becomes their script; after all, he needs tangible proof that there are others in the world who can mirror his authenticity, reflect it back to him so that he can be sure that he really does exist in the midst of an alien planet. . . . Spontaneity, that style of living in the world which speaks to both trust and confidence in the world, is absent in the world of the assimilaphobe. Hence in adhering to a script the assimilaphobe demands respect as a stereotype, not as a bona fide member of the liberal West. (113, emphasis added)

Hill does not believe that (non-Western) immigrants have a right to preserve their respective cultures, and his reasoning is premised upon an individualism that is both ontological and ethical in nature. Strictly speaking, his argument goes, only individuals exist, from which it follows that only individuals have rights, from which it follows that any kind of group respect -- whether formal or informal -- inevitably infringes upon the freedom and dignity of the individual human being. "It is a mistake," he explains, "to transfer the innate respect and reverence that we have for individuals on to the landscape of culture that is not an individuable whole, and that possesses none of the requisite attributes of individuals that make them deserving of such treatment" (102).

Gay marriage opponents, proponents of the burka, and culturally "narcissistic" (93) immigrants -- these are the illiberal peoples, according to Hill, with whom we should not get along, against whom we should engage in "moral insurrectionism" (x). And who is enabling them? The extremist multiculturalists, who are taken to task in chapters five and six for their excessive tolerance and its potentially deadly consequences. (At one point, for example, multiculturalists are explicitly blamed for honor killings.) However noble their intentions were, Hill argues, today the champions of multiculturalism are colluding with evil and weakening Western civilization; they are sabotaging democratic values in their cult-like pursuit of "difference qua difference at any cost" (152). As such, his book should ultimately be read as a warning, as a philosophical polemic against contemporary multiculturalism and the illiberal peoples who would take advantage of it.

How successful is the text? It depends. Some critics of multiculturalism may appreciate it as a source of red meat -- it is, for example, full of accounts of Muslims doing bad things[6] -- while other critics of multiculturalism may bemoan the conspicuous lack of actual philosophical engagement, which is to say that Hill says next to nothing about other relevant thinkers and their positions, critical or sympathetic. Indeed, this is how he describes his book in the preface:

[It] is . . . a free-standing political and ethical manifesto that is a formal work in cultural analysis and philosophical argumentation (say, in the style of Max Weber or Franz [sic] Fanon). I make my own philosophical arguments apart from an overall excessive overreliance on the extant literature on the myriad topics explored in this book. The arguments will have to stand on their own merits without being buttressed or legitimized in any form by historical philosophical traditions. (xi)

Hill says his book does not show an "excessive overreliance on the extant literature."[7] That is certainly true. What is also true is that he may have erred in the other direction, that he may have written in a vacuum, dismissing possible interlocutors and, at times, ignoring history itself. (Almost nothing, for example, is said about colonialism and institutionalized racism and their possible legacies.) And because there is so little engagement with other thinkers in the text, one frequently wonders: "Who exactly is he talking about? Do these people really exist? Or are they exaggerated caricatures and thus straw men?"[8] This is, to be sure, an issue that could have been avoided.

Another consequence of Hill's lack of philosophical engagement is his reliance on external critiques and his apparent dismissal of possible internal critiques. All of the arguments are external in nature, which is to say that they come from the unwavering standpoint of a secular liberal, from someone who does not believe that religious and/or theological argumentation can be rationally employed for progressive purposes. Hill does not consider the religious proponents of marriage equality because the "major religions and their philosophical viewpoints will always be at odds with homosexuality" (47), nor does he consider the Muslim opponents of the burka, whose (critical) commitment to Islam is basically dismissed as a form of false consciousness.[9] There is only one way to criticize illiberal peoples and their intolerable practices, he argues, and it is by means of the secular rationality of the demonstrably superior modern West.

Unfortunately, the precise nature of this secular rationality finds insufficient explanation -- to say nothing of actual justification. In chapter one, which is titled "Why We Should Try to Get Along Before Not Getting Along -- Moral Clarity, Cosmopolitanism and the Nature of Moral Disagreements," Hill tries to flesh out an objective approach to moral theory that will allow us, as rational beings, to make "moral judgments that are true" (29). What he constructs, however, is a confusing mishmash of deontology, utilitarianism, some Aristotelianism, and way more intuitionism than one would expect from an avowed rationalist. What he constructs is not an objective universalism, which is his explicit goal, but rather an ambitious particularism. As such, his rejection of religious and/or theological argumentation -- a somewhat self-congratulatory rejection[10] -- is both unjustified and impractical. After all, if Hill's mission is global liberalization, then should he not value liberality wherever it may be found?

Finally, related to these issues is one of the most striking -- and dismaying -- features of the book: the fact that Hill speaks for pretty much everybody and does not allow anybody to speak for himself or -- and this is key -- herself. Chapter four, for example, is about anti-assimilationist immigrants, but at no point are the actual voices of immigrants -- illiberal or otherwise -- taken seriously. Hill does not give them an opportunity to defend themselves, to explain why they (may) privilege racial and/or ethnic membership over and above the principled individualism that so many liberals valorize; he does not give them an opportunity to challenge his undeniably broad -- if not essentialistic -- characterization of them. Rather, he speaks for them and, lacking hermeneutical generosity, deliberately depicts them in the worst possible light.

Likewise, in chapter three, which is ostensibly about the oppression of Muslim women, there are no meaningful engagements with Muslim women about their own experiences, their own ideas. Hill recognizes the importance of "[empowering] Muslim women who aspire to activist work within burka communities" (79), but he does not discuss any of the Muslim women who are actually doing that work. Indeed, he relegates them to a few random endnotes at the back of the book, thereby, it could be argued, reinforcing the very power relationship that he supposedly wants to abolish.[11] Why not engage Muslim women? Why not engage immigrants? Hill provides no adequate answers to these questions, and it would no doubt be a better and fairer text if argumentative disengagement were not its most defining characteristic.

Hill, in conclusion, has legitimate concerns. When does tolerance become an excessive vice? How should we negotiate the tension between individualism and communalism? And the big one: What is the future of Western civilization and its liberal democracies? These are important questions, and Hill takes them very seriously here-- to say nothing of his previous two books.[12] The problem, however, is that he simply does not engage with other people, which makes the text monological as opposed to dialogical, less nuanced and prone to extreme descriptions of the world and its inhabitants. One should not, therefore, look to Civil Disobedience and the Politics of Identity for a sober assessment of these concerns, but rather accept it as a philosophical polemic that ultimately preaches to the anti-multiculturalist choir.

[1] As Hill says in Civil Disobedience, p. 93: "What makes the logic of contagion morally dubious is that it is a rejection of a culture's values qua values. One is not afraid of its food, music or national holidays  --  one is afraid of the mores and values that undergird the culture and society of which one is a member. It is this outright rejection of the mores and values of a host society without rational inquiry into their nature that makes anti-assimilation ripe with strife. To embrace a logic of contagion and to unquestioningly reject the values, mores and customs of a culture without first subjecting them to rational inquiry is to disrespect the culture of which one is a member."

[2] As he explains in Civil Disobedience, p. 47: "The major religions and their philosophical viewpoints will always be at odds with homosexuality."

[3] The law was passed in September 2010, and its passage was nearly unanimous. With very few exceptions, the law bans face-coverings in public, which applies not only to Muslim women and the burka, but also to protesters who -- for whatever reason -- want to remain anonymous by wearing ski or Guy Fawkes masks.

[4] See Samuel P. Huntington, The Clash of Civilizations and the Remaking of World Order (New York: Simon & Schuster, 2003).

[5] Hill is not a postmodernist, but his anti-essentialism strongly resembles the popular, somewhat knee-jerk anti-essentialism that so many postmodern thinkers have advanced in recent years.

[6] It is worth noting that Hill completely denies the existence of Islamophobia in the West, and that he congratulates (for lack of a better word) the Western countries for their restrained treatment of Muslims after the 9/11 attacks.

[7] This is an understatement, and the sparse -- and barely helpful -- index, which is not even three pages in length, very much confirms it.

[8] Ironically, it is Hill who accuses the multiculturalists of caricature. As he writes, p. 131, emphasis added: "What the multiculturalists are revolting against are the very liberal values that enable them to critique liberalism almost to the extent of being libelous . . . . They caricature not just the values of freedom of speech and liberty of conscience, but also the capability to exercise one's autonomy competency skills and to establish a perspectival shift for oneself within the confines of the liberal framework."

[9] One gets the impression from Hill that Muslims are unworthy of dialogical inclusion by virtue of their religious identification and regardless of their actual or potential liberality.

[10] Strangely, Hill extolls the virtues of secular reason, while also appealing to a fair amount of religious rhetoric. For example, he occasionally describes individual rights as "God-given."

[11] It is worth noting that Hill explicitly mentions "The Problem of Speaking for Others" by Linda Martín Alcoff, a popular essay that explores the potential pitfalls of well-intentioned speaking for others. Unfortunately, many of the pitfalls that are addressed in that essay are epitomized in Civil Disobedience and the Politics of Identity.

[12] Jason D. Hill, Becoming a Cosmopolitan: What It Means to Be a Human Being in the New Millennium (Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield, 2000) and Beyond Blood Identities: Posthumanity in the Twenty-First Century (Lanham: Lexington Books, 2009).