Classification, Disease and Evidence: New Essays in the Philosophy of Medicine

Placeholder book cover

Philippe Huneman, Gérard Lambert, and Marc Silberstein (eds.), Classification, Disease and Evidence: New Essays in the Philosophy of Medicine, Springer, 2015, 211pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789401788861.

Reviewed by Robert L. Perlman, University of Chicago


From the Hippocratic Oath to the Nuremberg Code and the Declaration of Helsinki, the philosophy of medicine has been dominated by medical ethics. Recently, however, there has been increased interest in other philosophical issues in medicine, especially in ontological and epistemological questions. Medicine raises the overarching question of the meaning of health and disease, and provides rich case studies that bear on broader issues in the philosophy of science, including causation, reduction, and the mind/body relationship. Moreover, philosophical analyses have important implications for medicine. Clarifying diagnostic categories and methods of diagnosis, and analyzing the evidence for the effects of medical interventions, are ethically significant because they have the potential to improve patient care. As the editors of Classification, Disease and Evidence note, "philosophical topics have direct ethical consequences" (xv).

The book comprises ten essays that present a sampling of recent work in the philosophy of medicine. It is nominally organized around the three concepts in the title, but in the order Disease, Classification, and Evidence. The first four chapters concern the nature of disease and of medicine. Three chapters deal with specific categories of disease -- infectious, psychiatric, and genetic -- motivated by the understanding that classification is an essential part of diagnosis. We want to know not just what disease a patient has but what kind of disease he or she has. Indeed, medicine is organized around specific classes of disease. Finally, three chapters deal with issues of evidence, or epistemology. How do we know what we think we know? What evidence is needed to provide reliable knowledge and to justify or rationalize medical decisions?

In "Objectivity, Scientificity, and the Dualist Epistemology of Medicine," Thomas V. Cunningham challenges the conventional view that medicine is both "science" and "art." Cunningham argues that the domain that has commonly been considered the art of medicine -- physicians' modes of communication, their knowledge of patients' histories, values and preferences, and the integration of this understanding into patient care -- is amenable to objective analysis under the rubric of clinical decision science, and so is also scientific. Moreover, Cunningham points out that recent philosophy of science has criticized the notions that science is value-free and that it is concerned only with general laws and not with particular phenomena. Cunningham concludes, "clinical medicine should be understood as an integrative science that draws on various methods, which are objective by varying degrees" (8), and "the popular philosophical distinction between the art and science of medicine ought to be rejected and in its place a unified multifaceted epistemology of medicine should be developed" (15). Whether it is better to think of medicine as a multi-faceted science than as a combination of science and art is questionable, but it is useful to be reminded that all aspects of medicine can be studied empirically and that knowledge gained from these different approaches needs to be integrated to optimize patient care.

Several contemporary philosophers, most notably Christopher Boorse and Jerome Wakefield, have proposed general theories of disease. Their proposals, which use concepts of normal function and dysfunction to distinguish between health and disease, have met with only limited acceptance. In "The Naturalization of the Concept of Disease," Maël Lemoine argues that we should focus on disease explanations, or disease mechanisms, rather than on judgments as to what is or is not a disease. Considering diseases in terms of their pathophysiological mechanisms, a methodology Lemoine calls naturalization, may allow a general theory of disease that has eluded conceptual analyses of the differences between disease and non-disease. Lemoine is optimistic that network medicine, the study of networks of connectivity between genes and environmental factors that are implicated in disease, or the closely related field of systems biology, will provide a framework for a general theory of disease. Grounding the philosophy of medicine in our best current understanding of human biology is certainly a good idea, but it isn't yet clear that either network medicine or systems biology will be able to do what Lemoine hopes they will.

Several chapters deal with psychiatry and mental disorders. Dominic Murphy's "What Will Psychiatry Become?" concerns the causal structure of mental illness. In the first part of his essay, Murphy makes the important distinction between reduction and levels. While psychiatry should strive to reduce mental illnesses to their causes, this does not necessarily entail reducing them to lower structural or functional levels. Thus, both genetics and unemployment may be causes of depression. Murphy goes on to consider psychiatry as a branch of cognitive neuroscience. In his view, "classification and causal explanation [of mental illness] will be ultimately founded on the neurophysiological organization of the mind" (47). In this process, neurobiological concepts will replace outmoded psychological concepts such as beliefs and desires. Murphy uses addiction to illustrate how psychiatric problems can be understood in terms of neuroscience. We can discuss addiction with reference to dopaminergic circuits and the like, and provide a causal model in terms of neurochemistry without need of psychological concepts. But addiction may not be a good model for all psychiatric disorders. And Murphy's analysis leads him to end on a somber note: "Psychiatrists will always need to be able to help people understand what they have become. The worry is that greater understanding of the mind will make it harder for us to explain people to themselves" (60).

Both Boorse and Wakefield discuss psychiatric illnesses, like other illnesses, as disorders of function. In "The Function Debate and the Concept of Mental Disorder" Steeves Demazeux considers the value of these approaches for psychiatry. Demazeux agrees with Boorse and Wakefield that mental diseases should be analyzed as a subset of disease in general, and that psychiatry is a legitimate branch of medicine. He argues, however, that there are flaws in both Boorse's and Wakefield's analyses, and that neither provide a valid framework for understanding mental disorders. It is difficult to identify individual mental functions or to develop objective criteria for distinguishing normal from pathological. Wakefield adopts an essentialist view of disease, and neither he nor Boorse takes sufficient account of variation among patients or of the natural history of disease. Deciding when in the course of a psychiatric or other medical problem a dysfunction should be considered a disease is a subjective matter. Demazeux ends by suggesting that we should consider individual psychiatric disorders separately and should be prepared to conclude that some may be considered mental diseases and others not.

The editors emphasize evolution and the new field of evolutionary medicine (or evolutionary medicine and public health, as it is now being called) in their introduction. Only one chapter, however, "Emerging Disease and the Evolution of Virulence: The Case of the 1918-1919 Influenza Pandemic" by Pierre-Olivier Méthot and Samuel Alizon, is explicitly concerned with evolution and medicine. Evolution is a two-step process, comprising variation (mutation) and selection. Since the rediscovery of Mendel's Laws at the beginning of the twentieth century, there has been a tension between the research programs that have emphasized one or the other of these two processes. Méthot and Alizon have used the 1918-1919 influenza pandemic as a case study to show how this tension continues to play out in our understanding of the evolution of virulence. One school of research seeks to find virulence factors, individual genes or suites of genes that increase the virulence of pathogens. Molecular biologists and geneticists have reconstructed the complete genomic sequence of the 1918-1919 pandemic influenza strain in an effort to determine the molecular causes of the high virulence of this strain. Another school focuses on the ecological factors that lead to the spread of more virulent pathogens. Ecologists have pointed to the crowding, poor nutrition, and poor health of troops at the front line of World War I, together with the transport of wounded soldiers to military hospitals, as creating the conditions that would select for increased virulence. While both approaches have yielded valuable information, neither by itself has explained the high virulence of this virus. Méthot and Alizon emphasize how the molecular and ecological research programs have been pursued independently, with little interaction, and sensibly call for an integration of these approaches to understanding the evolution of virulence. As we pay increasing attention to emerging infectious diseases, it will be important for physicians and biomedical scientists to heed this advice.

In "Power, Knowledge, and Laughter: Forensic Psychiatry and the Misuse of the DSM," Patrick Singy uses paraphilias as a case study to discuss the relationship between psychiatry and the law. In the first part of his chapter, Singy questions the objectivity of psychiatric diagnoses, pointing out, for example, that homosexuality used to be considered a mental disorder. He goes on to argue that even if psychiatric diagnoses were objective, psychiatry and the legal system are concerned with two different problems. Forensic psychiatrists are interested in whether or not a defendant has a mental illness, while the legal system must determine a defendant's capacity or incapacity to control his or her actions. Although mental diseases and incapacities are overlapping categories, they are not identical and are logically distinct. Singy claims that some people who are diagnosed with a paraphilia have the capacity to regulate their behavior and some do not. For this reason, he argues that psychiatric testimony about the presence or absence of a paraphilia or other mental disease has no place in the courtroom. In his view, psychiatry will enhance its legitimacy if it doesn't overstep its proper functions, and the law will be administered more fairly if it isn't distracted by psychiatric diagnoses.

"Defining Genetic Disease," by Catherine Dekeuwer, is the only chapter that is really concerned with the classification of diseases. Defining genetic disease turns out to be more complex than we might have thought. There is probably genetic variation in susceptibility to virtually all diseases. We study genetic risk factors because they may give insights into disease pathogenesis and into ways of manipulating the environment to prevent or ameliorate disease. Dekeuwer suggests that we define genetic disease as "a hereditary disease whose fundamental (molecular) defect has been identified at the level of DNA. This defect explains the disease's characteristics on higher levels (cellular, tissue, physiological)" (155). While this definition may express a laudable research goal, it does not accord with either the historic or the contemporary use of the term "genetic disease" in medicine. Long before genes were identified as DNA sequences, genetic diseases were defined as diseases that were inherited in a Mendelian fashion. Even today, when many "disease genes" have been cloned and sequenced, we often cannot explain disease phenotypes in terms of the absent or altered biological activities of the proteins that these genes specify. Genetic diseases are commonly recognized as hereditary diseases caused by alleles with a high level of penetrance or a flat norm of reaction, such that all or most of the people who inherit these alleles develop the disease. Again, however, there is no clear demarcation between genetic diseases and diseases for which there are genetic risk factors. Dekeuwer cautions against expanding the definition of genetic disease because of the common if unwarranted tendency to conflate "genetic" with "inevitable." She fears that our focus on genetic determinants of disease may reinforce folk notions of the geneticization of people and of human behavior.

In "Causal and Probabilistic Inferences in Diagnostic Reasoning: Historical Insight into the Contemporary Debate," Joël Coste highlights the different kinds of evidence and inferences that physicians use in making diagnoses. Causal reasoning is most applicable to genetic and infectious diseases. If physicians find specific genes or pathogens, they reason that these are the causes of disease, and make diagnoses accordingly. This kind of reasoning does not require knowledge or consideration of the pathophysiological mechanisms that intervene between the causes and the manifestations of disease. As noted above, we often do not understand how mutant alleles cause specific diseases. Physicians use pathophysiological reasoning for many neurological diseases, where they can determine the site of lesions from the pathophysiology even if they don't know the cause of these lesions, and in endocrinology, where analysis of feedback mechanisms can give insights into the seat of disease (hypothalamic, pituitary, or peripheral endocrine gland), again often without knowledge of the cause of the disease. Still other diseases are defined and diagnosed on the basis of their symptoms, even if neither the cause nor the pathophysiology of the disease is known. Coste contrasts this causal reasoning with what he calls probabilistic or empirical approaches to diagnosis, and notes the longstanding tension between deterministic and empirical approaches to diagnosis, or to medicine more broadly. Coste's conclusion, that this tension between the desire to explain and the desire to be effective is inherent to medicine, echoes Murphy's concern that the explanation of mental diseases in neurobiological terms may impede psychiatry's effectiveness.

"Risk Factor and Causality in Epidemiology," by Élodie Giroux, addresses the vexed problem of the relationship between risk factors and causality, or between risk factors and disease. The Framingham Heart Study, one of the major epidemiological studies of cardiovascular disease, identified risk factors for coronary heart disease but could provide little evidence that these risk factors were causal. At about the same time, studies of the association of cigarette smoking and lung cancer led to the argument that smoking was not just a risk factor for lung cancer but was actually causal. Bradford Hill developed criteria for making causal inferences from risk factor associations. With smoking and lung cancer, the evidence was overwhelming and the analysis relatively straightforward. The causal status of many other risk factors, however, has been open to debate. Some philosophers have advocated a probabilistic concept of cause, such that "a risk factor is considered causal because it increases the probability of its effect" (187). Many epidemiologists, however, have argued that causes must be analyzed in terms of their sufficiency and necessity, and the mechanistic connections between causes and effects. These differing views of the relationship between risk factors and causes have led to what Giroux refers to as "a tension between mechanistic considerations and statistical or probabilistic considerations" (188). Analyzing and resolving this tension remains a major challenge for philosophers of science. Giroux concludes by highlighting "the important part that epidemiology plays in the development of criteria for causal inference" (190).

Evidence-based medicine is governed by a hierarchy of evidence according to which systematic reviews or meta-analyses of randomized, controlled clinical trials are at the top of the hierarchy and anecdotal observations are at the bottom. Despite many criticisms of this hierarchy, it remains the prevailing way of evaluating evidence to guide medical interventions. In "Herding QATs: Quality Assessment Tools for Evidence in Medicine," Jacob Stegenga raises other difficult problems with evidence hierarchies. He points out that clinical trials have many elements -- randomization, blinding (or masking), placebo or other controls, withdrawals or dropouts, etc. In comparing studies, how does one weight these various elements? Many authors have developed what Stegenga refers to as Quality Assessment Tools, or QATs. Because these different QATs assign different weights to the various components of clinical trials, there is poor inter-tool reliability. Although Stegenga believes that QATs should replace hierarchies in the assessment of evidence, there is as yet no theoretical or empirical way of assessing the QATs themselves. Whether QATs will replace or supplement evidence hierarchies remains to be seen, but as Stegenga shows, not only may the available evidence underdetermine appropriate medical decision-making, but the quality of the evidence itself is underdetermined. Evidence-based medicine is directly concerned with improving patient care, and so the development of better ways of assessing evidence is one of the philosophy of medicine's most important ethical projects.

The essays in this collection are interesting, opinionated, and provocative. They express original, personal views rather than the conventional wisdom on the subjects they discuss. Even when the authors' arguments are not convincing, they are thought provoking and worth considering. Unfortunately, the book itself is poorly edited and does not add much value to the individual contributions. Several topics, including general theories of disease and the nature of mental illness, are discussed in more than one chapter, but with the exception of one footnote the authors make no reference to one another, and without an index it is difficult for readers to relate the various arguments of the different authors. Four of the essays were initially published in French. The editors do not identify the translator(s) of these chapters. And as one other annoying example of poor editing, different authors use different citation formats. The intended audience for this collection isn't clear. While many readers will be interested in one or several chapters, I suspect that few will want to read the whole book.