Cogent Science in Context: The Science Wars, Argumentation Theory, and Habermas

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William Rehg, Cogent Science in Context: The Science Wars, Argumentation Theory, and Habermas, MIT Press, 2009, 345pp., $40.00 (hbk) ISBN 9780262182713.

Reviewed by Paul A. Roth, University of California-Santa Cruz



Books can easily be found that offer to examine and account for the “science wars”, understood as the ongoing turf battle between philosophers and sociologists. The focus of the conflict concerns how to explain what considerations actually determine what comes to be accepted as the received views in any one of the natural sciences. The main contenders consist of two apparently opposed explanatory strategies. On the one hand, some advocate the primacy of contextual factors in order to explain why a scientific community settles on a particular view. On such accounts, the norms of scientific inquiry represent only the contingent products of historical circumstance. On the other hand, “internalist” accounts typically seek to establish that evidence can be and is rationally determinative. Evaluative procedures can have validity that transcend their context. On this view, use of proper rational procedure explains what prevails and why within a scientific community. The former view denies and the latter affirms that standards of rationality simpliciter can and do explain accepted scientific views. Unfortunately, authors of such books all too typically begin by assuming the correctness of one of the usual suspects with regard to accounts of scientific rationality.

William Rehg’s book proceeds by urging that resources can be located for an account of rationality that embraces neither of these views and yet incorporates core contentions of each. Specifically, Rehg argues for the relevance of “argumentation theory”, an area of inquiry that straddles several disciplines and with which most philosophers of science will probably be unfamiliar. The “argumentation theory” as Rehg portrays it refers to studies of argument that represent “an interdisciplinary endeavor that provides a set of categories — drawn from logic, linguistics, dialectic, rhetoric, and so on — for the description and evaluation of arguments” (4). Rehg offers a straightforward rationale for taking this approach: “Like other areas of human endeavor, the sciences exist and develop as social practices — exercises in embodied social rationality … This trend challenged defenders of science to develop more realistic conceptions of scientific rationality” (3). Argumentation theory as Rehg conceives of it holds the promise of providing a general normative framework for the evaluation of scientific claims that is superior in specific ways to the alternatives scouted above. His book promises a sustained and detailed account of how to construct this framework.

Rehg employs the term ‘cogency’ to connote the joint process of assessing both the psychological effect and the rational strength of an argument. The appeal to cogency arises inasmuch as no one set of factors — logical, rhetorical, or sociological — typically suffices to make the case in favor of one view over another. The question that Rehg poses, and the litmus test for the approach of his book, concerns whether or not Rehg’s contextualist version of argumentation theory offers a more robust normative framework than any of the alternatives that Rehg finds inadequate to the task of adjudicating disputes on the cogency of scientific claims. The primary challenge to the cogency of scientific argument consists in the need to bridge what Rehg terms “Kuhn’s gap”, understood as “a gap between logical and social-institutional perspectives, a gap that rhetorics of science attempt to bridge” (33). More specifically, in order to close Kuhn’s gap, an argumentation theory must reveal “how persuasion occurs within the transitional phase itself — the microprocesses that generate agreement on the new paradigm” (47). Kuhn’s work poses the question but provides no answer. The gap will only be closed, however, in a philosophically satisfactory way by providing an account of cogency that demonstrates that scientists were persuaded to shift theoretical allegiances for the “right” reasons, i.e., that no group made a weaker argument appear the stronger.

Rehg’s work moves from analogs to Hempel’s analysis of science confirmation to sociological accounts that purport to trump the rationales of scientists to, ultimately, what Rehg terms a “contextualist alternative” to a Habermasian style communication theory. Rehg ultimately maintains that “democratic accountability” within the relevant demos underwrites his “normative analysis of cogency” (5). This he holds to provide the best possible normative framework for assessing scientific claims.

Rehg segments his approach into three general parts, each consisting of three chapters. The first introduces readers to Rehg’s account of “science as argumentative practice”. The main burden of this section is to establish how Kuhn’s gap between what conventional logics of science recommend and what actual scientific practice exhibits creates an explanatory need for a more capacious notion of cogency than that imagined by pre-Kuhnian logics of science. The first section also examines four relatively recent but ultimately unsuccessful attempts to address Kuhn’s gap. Two are by argumentation theorists — Marcello Pera and Lawrence Prelli. Rehg also considers a theory by the enfant terrible of science studies, Bruno Latour. Finally, Rehg diffracts through the lenses of argumentation theory Peter Achinstein’s extensive work on the concept of evidence.

The second and third sections introduce, respectively, Habermas’s version of critical communication theory and how it applies to science, and then Rehg’s own contextualist version of the Habermasian project. For a Habermasian, the search for context transcending principles by which to form a genuinely rational consensus remains a viable intellectual project. At the core of his proposal resides a dialogical conception of rationality. As Rehg puts it,

Habermas’s argumentation theory implies that the cogency of arguments depends not only on their logical structure and content, but also on the dialectical and rhetorical virtues of the social institutional procedures and processes that generate them. (105)

Habermas incorporates a Popperian-like assumption into the core of his account of rational accountability (what Rehg also terms ‘rational agency’), viz., that those committed to making rational truth claims accept that they may be defeasible (114). Moreover, the test of truth claims should, in some sense, reside in common experience (116). Additionally, the evaluation of procedures must be carried out within what could be recognized as an open and non-coercive institutional framework. (See Rehg’s summary of this on pp. 159-60.) The latter condition has particular significance, Rehg believes, because it must be understood counter-factually — as approximating conditions that do not, but might, exist.

Rehg addresses worries whether such an idealized model of argumentation can be actually instantiated by providing a detailed case study that, he suggests, instantiates the Habermasian model. Here he relies on Kent Staley’s account of how the Collider Detector group at Fermilab negotiated the process of writing a paper announcing evidence for the existence of a top quark. The group was comprised of a diverse array of experimentalists and theoreticians (diverse both in expertise and temperament). In order to meet the demands of cogency from this group, the "paper could not go forward until the group was satisfied with its adequacy" (181, emphasis added). The key notion of “group adequacy” shifts the example into Rehg’s realm of argumentation theory. What makes for such adequacy involves the institutional features of the discussion. That is, Rehg maintains, the scientists in this case “could not solve these logical problems apart from a dialectical assessment of the procedures employed in collecting and analyzing data” (182).

Thus, although the example suggests that the Habermasian model does allow for practical application, it also reveals what Rehg regards as a key weakness with Habermas’s proposal. This concerns the status of compromise in reaching agreement. For the fact of compromise threatens to push the model’s claim to cogency over into the sociological realm where ‘cogency’ involves no assurance of rational acceptability secured by proper procedures. Rather, compromise might simply signal political weakness, lack of character to stand up for what one believes, or some similar feature that engenders agreement but does not underwrite cogency in the desired normative sense. Rehg explains, “Pressure of this sort apparently violates Habermas’s dialectical process idealizations, specifically the requirement of freedom from coercion, thus rendering the outcome problematic” (186).

This sets up Rehg’s dénouement to his second section, where he asks in effect whether Habermas’s project of a robustly rational approach to adjudicating scientific disputes can co-exist with that of the “principled relativism” of, e.g., the Strong Programme in the Sociology of Knowledge associated with Barry Barnes and David Bloor (196). Rehg terms the relativism “principled” inasmuch as it applies equally and everywhere, including to the process of sociological explanation itself. The explanatory strategy qualifies as relativistic since it only draws from standards embraced by scientists. Given Kuhn’s gap, a bridge (from evidence to conclusion) must be constructed from beliefs other than those secured by evidence. Thus, considerations relative to other beliefs a scientist holds will help determine what a scientist ultimately concludes.

Rehg takes an optimistic stance on whether a philosophical interest in the question of what ought to have been believed on the basis of evidence can fruitfully work together with the sociological interest in what factors actually swayed scientific opinion: “My question is whether a collaborative ‘critical science studies’ (CSS) is possible involving these two approaches. I argue that it is — but that the moves such collaboration requires point to a deeper problem in Habermas’s approach” (196). The deeper problem to which Rehg alludes concerns just the previously noted counter-factual conditions on which the assessment of institutional procedures relies. Rehg offers a strategy to sidestep this issue because he maintains that “the critical appraisal can appeal to less ambitious standards than the idealizations articulated by Habermas and others” (200). Rehg devotes his third and final section to articulating CSS as his via media between, on the one hand, the “justificational atheism” of sociologists of science (who believe in reasons, but not in Reason), and, on the other hand, the framework-transcendent rationalism of Habermas.

Interestingly, debates here mirror debates about normativity triggered by Quine’s call to naturalize epistemology. Sociologists such as Barry Barnes explicitly invoke Quine as a fellow traveler, as someone who endorses a conception of what Barnes terms “natural rationality”, a conception of rationality learned only by empirical study of how people actually reason. In this respect, Barnes anticipates the sort of empirical work that challenges the explanatory efficacy of philosophical accounts of reasoning. On the ground and at the time, in Barnes’s sociological view, the reasons that do the persuasive work belong to the category of natural rationality. For Barnes, post hoc idealizations of rationality have no explanatory value with respect to accounting for scientific beliefs.

Rehg’s discussion makes apparent that any attempt to move beyond “natural rationality” as explanatory must satisfy the Habermasian craving for a higher standard of normativity/rationality. That is, Rehg suggests that a lower bar can be set and yet still approximate the sort of rational deliberative outcome that Habermas hoped to secure (201). So, practitioners of CSS can have their explanatory cake and eat it too; Reason can (at least potentially) be shown to be working itself out in a context where there exist only reasons. Had Kuhn taken Hegel more to heart, Rehg’s view implies, the implications of Kuhn’s gap discussed in the notorious Chapter XIII of The Structure of Scientific Revolutions might have had a very different cast.

Rehg attempts to bridge Kuhn’s gap by securing scientific consensus formation to factors whose presence makes for a consensus founded on scientific principles that could be recognized by the group in question. The counterfactual condition provides a substantive alternative to the sociological model presumably because the counterfactual conditional holds no interest for the explanatory purposes of a sociologist. CSS can allow this in the name of inter-disciplinary harmony, i.e., this does not make sociological accounts any the worse as explanations. But CSS also allows the philosophically minded to note that theoretical uptake may have failed to be scientific even by standards that the decision makers themselves could have (and perhaps even ought to have) acknowledged. A theory can be deemed rational (or not) by a standard that requires nothing but beliefs taken from that context. This weakened idealization constitutes how CSS improves on its Habermasian counterpart (208-9).

Yet, Rehg asks, do counterfactual conditions so conceived provide a real critical edge for ascertaining in a non-contextual sense the cogency of arguments? He writes,

can contextually indexed ideas of reason … provide critical leverage, or must they fall captive, finally, to the status quo precisely because they depend so heavily on participants’ situated — and often ad hoc — methods? (231)

Rehg undertakes to answer this in section III. Here he uses insights provided by ethnomethodology to reconfigure Habermas’s conception of the pragmatics of language. Rehg’s answer, although clear and straightforward, remains unavoidably tied to local contexts and their immanent standards:

Two things keep this model of scientific argumentation from collapsing inward and sealing off each context with its own standards of cogency: the context-transcending notion of truth and the fact that scientists typically operate with multiple contexts of relevance simultaneously in view. Consequently, the contexualist model allows both immanent and context transcending modes of critique. (241-2)

Since Rehg’s model shares the first feature with Habermas’s, the second must make good the promise to differentiate his approach from the Habermasian.

This can only be done, Rehg acknowledges, by case studies. For, absent general principles to which to appeal and given all the vagaries to which actual cases may succumb, to establish that the proposal has any normative traction requires showing that cases can be analyzed in a way that yields the promised philosophical/normative results. Thus, Rehg’s final section, which discusses how a series of National Academy of Science panels handled a controversy regarding the alleged connections between diet and health, takes on great significance in terms of finally underwriting Rehg’s positive proposal (242-92).

However, when all is said and done, the best that Rehg can offer by way of assessment of the case he examines is that “the committee seems to have done a passably good job with the content and transactional merits of their arguments” (267-8). But how does this function as a principled bridge of Kuhn’s gap? After all, a significant obstacle to constructing such a bridge by engaging only contextual standards involved the status of compromise. Absence of controversy may have many explanations, some of which count against cogency, e.g., when consensus formation or absence of criticism results from intimidation or just plain lack of courage to speak out. More importantly, it appears to be an empirical question as to what institutional structures (within or without science) secure rational discourse. Yet how can one answer this question without begging it, i.e., without some prior assumption regarding what makes for rational discourse? Democratic procedures may satisfy a call for openness, but this needs to be shown to abet the rational.

In short, whether or not argumentation theory can deliver what Rehg initially promises will remain unknown unless and until one also has in hand an account of the institutional structures needed to secure the type of discourse Rehg imagines necessary. Yet one might well suspect that an analog to a Kuhn gap exists for social theorists just as it does for scientific investigators. The search for an institutional theory thus seems to threaten a regress. For it appears that in a political context one can raise all the questions that Kuhn raised in a scientific one, e.g., how does one measure progress in such cases? Without begging the question (i.e., without just assuming that ‘more democratic’=‘better’), I do not see that Rehg has any answer. Without such answers, however, the appeal to argumentation theory can fare no better than the usual suspects it strives to replace. In the end, Rehg’s book greatly clarifies what it would be to have scientific controversies satisfy the ideals of a critical theorist, but it provides no forward movement on understanding the substantive content required for getting this done.