Common Sense: A Contemporary Defense

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Noah Lemos, Common Sense: A Contemporary Defense, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 208pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521837847.

Reviewed by John Greco, Fordham University


This book by Noah Lemos is an explication and defense of the common sense tradition in philosophy, especially in epistemology, as embodied by Thomas Reid, G. E. Moore and Roderick Chisholm. A fourth philosopher who figures prominently in the book is Ernest Sosa, whom Lemos invokes at several junctures to help answer objections raised against the common sense tradition. The book is well organized and clearly written, and offers a valuable treatment of relevant issues in the three major figures. Lemos does not attempt to provide a general introduction to any of these philosophers, however. Rather, he focuses on those substantive and methodological issues central to their membership in the common sense tradition. In doing so, he treats a number of issues that are clearly relevant to contemporary discussions in philosophy. For example, many contemporary epistemologists endorse a "particularist" methodology, which Lemos identifies as a central feature of the common sense tradition. Also important to contemporary concerns is the "neo-Moorean" response to skepticism, more on which will follow below.

The book begins by identifying some major features of the common sense tradition. Perhaps most important among these is that "we may take as data for philosophical inquiry many of the things we ordinarily think we know." (xii) Or again, "we should take various common sense propositions as data for assessing philosophical theories." (1) Among these data are "that there are other people, that they have bodies, that they think, that they know various things about the world around them." (4) Moreover, it is among the data of common sense that many people know many such things -- that some "common sense propositions are matters of common knowledge." (4) As such, common sense propositions can and should be employed in assessing philosophical theories: if a philosophical theory conflicts with common sense, then that is good reason to think that the theory is false. On Lemos's characterization, then, the common sense tradition endorses both substantive and methodological theses. Substantively, it holds that several "deeply and widely held" propositions about ourselves and the world are true, and that many of us know many such truths. Methodologically, it holds that philosophical theories should be assessed accordingly. For example, if a theory of knowledge implies that we don't know that we have bodies or that there are other minds, then that theory ought to be rejected.

The common sense tradition is not committed to several other theses, however. For example, it is not committed to the idea that there is some special faculty of common sense. Nor is it committed to the idea that common sense propositions are known or epistemically justified in virtue of their being common sense propositions. Similarly, philosophical theories are not to be rejected in virtue of their conflicting with common sense. Rather, the idea is that certain things are, and ought to be recognized as, common knowledge. "In arguing this way, the emphasis is on the fact that the theory conflicts with something known, something that also happens to be common sense." (7)

According to the common sense tradition, we can take common sense propositions as data for philosophical reflection because such propositions are known or epistemically justified. This claim, however, invites two objections. The first invokes the age-old "problem of the criterion," arguing that we cannot pick out instances of knowledge without first having a criterion of knowledge. But since common sense philosophers offer no such criterion, their claim that we have common knowledge to use as data for philosophical reflection is undermined. The second objection is related to the first. The beliefs that common sense philosophers take as data are knowledge only if one knows that they are reliably formed. But the only way to know that they are reliably formed is via a non-circular argument to that effect. Since common sense philosophers have provided no such argument, it is false that their data qualify as knowledge. Much of the book is devoted to addressing these two objections.

Lemos takes up the second objection in chapter two. There he follows Sosa quite closely, arguing that knowledge does not require a non-circular argument to the conclusion that our cognitive faculties are reliable. Moreover, we can achieve a reflective knowledge of our own reliability by engaging in track-record arguments, and even "Moorean" arguments of the following form: I know that here is a hand, and I could only know that if my perception were reliable. Therefore, my perception is reliable. Such arguments offer explanatory coherence in a way that is not viciously circular. In later chapters Lemos defends this approach against objections from contemporary critics of externalism and from Reid himself. Lemos sides with Sosa here, and in an interesting discussion he shows that Reid's objections to circular reasoning in Descartes are inconsistent with Reid's own considered position.

Lemos directly addresses the first objection in a chapter on Chisholm and the problem of the criterion. There Lemos defends Chisholm's particularism, the position that we correctly start with instances of things we think we know, and then develop epistemic principles and theories of justification and knowledge on that basis. He considers and rejects some arguments in favor of alternative views, and he answers several contemporary objections against common sense particularism.

One of the most interesting discussions in the book concerns a dilemma facing particularists who also think that our knowledge of epistemic principles is a priori. As Lemos points out, there is a tension here: if epistemic principles are known a priori, then how can intuitions about particular cases count for or against such principles? The problem is severe for someone like Chisholm, who held that basic a priori knowledge is certain and indefeasible. Lemos's solution is to defend a "modest" view of a priori knowledge, holding that a priori justification can be less than certain and that it can be defeated by other considerations.

Another interesting discussion in the book concerns common sense particularism and moral knowledge. Suppose we think, with G. E. Moore and others, that utilitarianism is the correct moral theory. Then the common sense philosopher is faced with two skeptical arguments, each to the conclusion that we cannot know that a particular action is right or wrong.

Argument A

1. A particular act is right in virtue of its maximizing utility. Its being right supervenes on the fact that it maximizes utility.

2. Therefore, in order to know that a particular act is right, one must know that it maximizes utility.

3. But we cannot know what maximizes utility.

4. Therefore, we cannot know that a particular action is right. (171)

Argument B

Let p be the proposition that some particular action is wrong and let q be the proposition that the action in fact maximizes utility.

1. If one is to know that p, then one must rule out every possibility that one knows is incompatible with one's knowing that p.

2. We know that q is incompatible with one's knowing p.

3. We cannot exclude q. We cannot know that not-q.

4. Therefore, we do not know that p. (175)

Regarding Argument A, Lemos rejects the move from premise 1 to premise 2. It is false that when one property supervenes on another, then we can know that the supervening property is instantiated only if we know that the base property is instantiated. For example, even if mental states supervene on physical states of the brain, it does not follow that knowledge of mental states requires knowledge of the underlying brain states.

Argument B proves more difficult. Lemos accepts the Principle of Exclusion stated in premise 1. Utilitarians should accept premise 2 and many philosophers, including Moore and Lemos, accept premise 3. In fact, Moore accepted the conclusion of the argument, reasoning that one cannot know that a particular action is right or wrong because one cannot know the long-term consequences of alternative actions. But here Lemos outdoes Moore, arguing that since we can know that a particular action is right or wrong, utilitarianism must be false. As Lemos argues, this line of reasoning is in keeping with the common sense methodology endorsed by Moore elsewhere. Lemos writes,

Given Moore's approach to various skeptical arguments about the external world, it is striking that he would not also reject this sort of reasoning for skepticism about the rightness or wrongness of particular actions… . I suggest that it is more reasonable for us to accept that we do know that some particular actions are right or wrong than it is to hold that all the premises of Argument B are true… . If that approach is reasonable in epistemology in general, than I do not see why it is not also reasonable in moral epistemology or in moral philosophy. (180)

This seems exactly right to me.

One thing that Lemos does not get exactly right in my opinion is the relationship between particularism and the method of reflective equilibrium. First, Lemos could be more clear about what particularism is. Following Chisholm, Lemos defines particularism in terms of two questions central to the theory of knowledge.

A. What do we know? What is the extent of our knowledge?

B. How are we to decide whether we know? What are the criteria of knowledge? (106)

The particularist thinks that we can begin with an answer to A and then work out an answer to B. By contrast, the "methodist" thinks that we can begin with an answer to B and then work out an answer to A. Understood this way, particularism and methodism are alternative methodologies in epistemology. They are recommendations regarding where we can begin our theorizing and how theory construction should proceed.

Elsewhere, however, Lemos defines particularism and methodism in terms of substantive epistemological theses. He writes, "Following Sosa, I shall take methodism and particularism to make claims about epistemic dependence. Methodism claims that our knowledge of particular epistemic propositions depends on our knowing general epistemic principles, and particularism does not." (107) But Michael DePaul warns us against this mistake. We should not confuse a methodology, which tells us how theories should be constructed, with an epistemology, which tells us how things are known. Thus someone who endorses particularism as a methodology for arriving at a theory of knowledge might endorse coherentism as a theory of knowledge. For that matter, someone who endorses particularism as a methodology for epistemology could endorse skepticism as a substantive thesis in epistemology.

Suppose we follow DePaul and understand particularism and methodism as methodologies for epistemology rather than substantive epistemic theses. How is particularism related to the method of reflective equilibrium? The method of reflective equilibrium (or "wide reflective equilibrium") is characterized by Lemos as follows:

In the method of wide reflective equilibrium, one begins with (1) one's particular considered judgments, (2) one's beliefs in general principles, and (3) general background theories. One then seeks to achieve a coherent balance or 'equilibrium' between these various elements. In some cases, this might require abandoning or revising one's particular judgments in favor of, say, a general principle that seems, on reflection, more reasonable. In other cases, one might give up or revise the general principle in favor of the particular judgment. (9)

Lemos then says that "the common sense tradition is compatible with the method of wide reflective equilibrium." (9) This is not clear, however. For Lemos has characterized the common sense tradition as endorsing particularism, and it is not clear that the method of reflective equilibrium is consistent with particularism. Indeed, the method would seem to be a third methodology in epistemology. It recommends that we begin with both our intuitions about particular cases and our beliefs about general principles, and that we bring these into a coherent equilibrium. On this view, neither our intuitions about particular cases nor our beliefs about general principles should be privileged methodologically.

One might think that this is splitting hairs -- that a charitable reading of particularism makes it equivalent with the method of reflective equilibrium. For even a particularist is willing to give up some intuitions about particular cases in favor of overall coherence. But if we look at the considerations that common sense philosophers have invoked in favor of particularism over methodism, we see that those same considerations favor particularism over the method of reflective equilibrium. For what common sense philosophers hold is that common sense beliefs (including beliefs about what is known in particular cases) ought to be privileged over philosophical theories. According to Moore, "the fact that, if Hume's argument were true, I could not know of the existence of this pencil, is a reductio ad absurdum of those principles." According to Reid, "though common sense and external senses demand my assent to their dictates upon their own authority, yet philosophy is not entitled to this privilege."

The point, I take it, is that common sense and philosophical principles are not on a par. Reid and Moore think that, regarding many particular cases, we know that we know. But the point need not be so strong. To defend a particularist methodology, one need only claim that our intuitions about particular cases (many of which will be common sense and common knowledge) are more reliable than our philosophical theories. Even weaker: only the former have even a chance at being reliably formed. They are, at least, consistent and widely shared. By contrast, our philosophical theories are inconsistent and parochial. As such, they have nothing at all to recommend them as a methodological starting point. All this speaks in favor of particularism over methodism, but it also speaks in favor of particularism over the method of reflective equilibrium.