Communities of Respect: Grounding Responsibility, Authority, and Dignity

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Bennett W. Helm, Communities of Respect: Grounding Responsibility, Authority, and Dignity, Oxford University Press, 2017, 256pp., $65.00, ISBN 9780198801863.

Reviewed by Caroline T. Arruda, The University of Texas at El Paso


On P.F. Strawson's influential account of the reactive attitudes, we are justified in holding both ourselves and others morally responsible just in case it is appropriate to praise or blame them (or ourselves) for their (or our) actions. But when it is appropriate to do so? In this ambitious and complex book, Bennett Helm argues that a complete account of these attitudes (and a sentimentalist account of the emotions more broadly) requires an explanation of the social grounds of respect and the attendant notions of authority and dignity, which he contends a standard Strawsonian account cannot provide.

But in what sense are these concepts conceptually or explanatorily connected to one another? Helm argues that the problem of the "warrant" for, or the "fittingness" of, these attitudes highlights why such an account is needed (p.11). The question of when praise or blame is warranted is not easily solved by providing an explanation of the "ontologically, explanatorily, and rationally prior properties of the agent that merit our praise or blame" (p.12). An explanation of this type will, Helm thinks, run the risk of being viciously circular (p.12) in that it will not be able to explain why these attitudes are independently justified. In its place, Helm advocates shifting the focus to determining how these attitudes, when appropriate, arise from communally held norms to which we, as a group, are committed. To show why this is a promising, albeit circuitous, route to the question of the reactive attitudes' warrant, Helm aims to answer two questions:

  1. whether the agent is in fact bound by the relevant norms [from which reactive attitudes and emotions more broadly emerge] (p.12).
  2. whether the subject of the reactive attitudes has the relevant authority to hold the agent responsible (p.12).

To answer these questions, Helm suggests that the most promising place to look is a "fundamentally social understanding [of] what it is to be a person . . .  in terms of the notion of a community of respect" (p.7).

On Helm's view, communities of respect have two objects of concern insofar as its members respect:

  1. its governing norms through the formation of emotions (including the reactive attitudes) that are rationally responsive to those norms (pp.77-78)
  2. their fellow members as having the authority to make demands of one another in light of these governing norms (pp.77-78)

That communities of respect are not only defined by the interpersonal respect we show to fellow members, but also by the grounding norms of the community, underscores why Helm thinks they provide the beginnings of an answer to (1) and (2) above. By explaining (a), Helm provides an answer to (1) and, in explaining (b), he thereby provides an answer to (2). Although this account will explain only what Helm classifies as "non-moral" communities of respect (such as one's membership in an academic department[1]), Helm takes it to have interesting implications for building an analogously structured argument concerning the moral community of all rational persons (p.22).

Helm makes a number of interesting moves in the context of developing this argument, but I will limit my comments to two aspects of the argument that I take to be central: (1) the nature and justification for what he calls the "first-person plural" notion of a community of respect; (2) the "rational pattern of emotions" that Helm argues captures the sense in which emotions (and reactive attitudes in particular) are warranted. I will then identify two potential problems for the argument, with a particular focus on whether Helm's view can avoid the charge of relativism.

Setting aside why Helm argues that we need an account of communities of respect, I would like to consider first what their defining characteristics are. Recall that he begins from the claim that we need a "social understanding of the person" (p.7). Here Helm means that persons are social in two analogous senses: first, we can display respect for other members of the community; second, in doing so, we show respect for the norms that ground the community such that we treat them as binding and authoritative (pp.77-78). Simply put, on Helm's view, we are part of communities of respect in that we display proper respect for its members (including ourselves) in light of the warrant of its norms.

One feature that distinguishes Helm's view from other views of the interpersonal character of respect, such as Darwall's (2006) account of the second-personal standpoint, is that the perspective from which we respect both other members of the community and the norms of the community are jointly held (pp.177-8).[2] In Helm's language, each member of the community grants other members authority and judges the community's grounding norms to be binding from the "first person plural" standpoint (pp.177-8). If we are members of a norm-governed community -- say, we volunteer at the local animal shelter -- we are part of a community of respect just in case there are conditions under which our members have authority to make demands of one another (e.g., we remind one another of our individual promises to rotate our volunteer schedule) and we recognize that our group's norms are binding (e.g., that no single member is to be regularly expected to clean the kennels after an adoption). These communities' import, it would seem, lies in the fact that when one of us asks for a justification for, say, sticking to our volunteer schedule, any reply we give would be from the perspective of the shared commitment we have to the standing of our members and to the specific norms that guide us.[3]

Here I should emphasize that, on Helm's view, we can belong to multiple communities of respect governed by plausibly competing norms, given that the norms in question are what he classifies as "non-moral" (p.22). Nonetheless, Helm's view presumably generalizes to what he (and perhaps those with neo-Kantian views of respect and dignity) would describe as the community of all rational persons, and, thereby, the moral community as such (p.145).

One specific aspect of Helm's view that sets the stage for the normative theory just mentioned is his account of the warrant for the reactive attitudes and the emotions more broadly. For simplicity, I will use the term 'emotions' to include the reactive attitudes, given that they share the same relevant characteristics and play a similar role in communities of respect (p.70).

For Helm, emotions are justified responses to states of affairs just in case they are warranted. But in what sense is an emotion warranted? Here it is worth noting that he specifically rejects the language of "fittingness" in favor of "warrant" (p.37, n. 12). What is the reason for this preference? It is not, I think, merely linguistic; rather, Helm contends that talk of fittingness cannot fully explain emotions' unique attitudinal structure. For him, emotions have both cognitive and conative features, which he thinks an appeal to "fittingness" cannot fully explain (p.13). But what makes emotions unique is not simply that they have both of these characteristics. It is that they have what Helms dubs a "focus" (p.37). Their focus is not simply the state of affairs or object to which they are primarily directed; rather, emotions' "focus" is a function of what is "rationally important to us" (p.37). Thus, emotions reflect what Helm characterizes as a "rational pattern," which invites the rational evaluation of a particular emotional response in terms of whether it accurately reflects what we take to have import (p.39). More important, this pattern underwrites practically rational standards for additional emotions that we adopt (via the requirement of consistency) (p.39). This account of emotions' rational patterns provides a route to explaining their warrant, as I discuss below.

To illustrate emotions' complex structure, Helm uses the example of the fear he feels when seeing kids playing baseball close to his car. The focus of his fear is not his car itself; rather, it is his car in light of the practical import he takes the car to have (p.37). In what sense is this emotion warranted such that not only can he justifiably say that he has responded appropriately to the state of affairs, but he also has the authority to hold others accountable for appreciating (or failing to appreciate) this fear?[4] This emotion is warranted, and thereby brings with it rational standards for additional, future emotions that he might adopt (such as taking care to protect his bicycle from the rain) only if two conditions obtain. First, the import he assigns to the car conforms to the norms he holds concerning what matters to him. Second, his judgment that the kids' baseball game does indeed pose a likely threat to his car's windshield is individually warranted. (Helm does not make this condition explicit, but it stands to reason that it holds.)

Yet, unlike the garden-variety case of his fear over the potential damage to his car's windshield discussed above, the relevant emotions that ultimately matter for Helm's account are those that are a function of the norms that ground communities of respect. They are appropriate responses to the states of affairs to which they are directed given that they reflect the grounding norms of the communities of respect of which one is a part. In this regard, reactive attitudes in particular are "evaluations (whether emotional or otherwise) focused on a community of respect and subfocused on one or more of its members and norms" (p.225).

Although the self-described aim of Helm's account is to explain the grounding role that communities of respect play in responsibility attributions, I take his account of emotions' (and reactive attitudes') warrant to play an equally central role in the argument. In particular, Helm's account of the latter explains: (1) why and how we are justified in holding others responsible or making general (moral) demands of them; and (2) why emotions (and reactive attitudes) exhibit a rational pattern such that they place constraints on the further emotional responses to which we should properly attend and provide the beginnings of a view of practical rationality.

I find this aspect of Helm's account particularly intriguing (and of interest to anyone concerned with fitting attitude views of value and response-dependence views in metaethics). Still, there are a number of worries I have about this account. First, one may worry that this account of the emotions' warrant is viciously circular. Helm anticipates this concern, arguing that:

the account I offer of the relationship between emotions and import in general involves a kind of non-vicious circularity such that things have import to us only in virtue of the rational structure of our emotions, and our emotions have this rational structure (and hence are potentially warranted or not) only because they are responses to the import of their focuses (p.147).

While I see how this circularity is potentially non-vicious, I suggest that Helm's answer to this charge simply raises additional worries. In particular, it is not clear how strongly we should read what he describes as the "rational pattern" of the emotions.[5] That emotions can display this pattern is supposed to show why our emotional responses are warranted even if they are reflective only of the import that the grounding norms of a community give to certain objects, activities, states of affairs and persons.

Yet why should we be convinced that this pattern, simply by virtue of being 'rational,' preserves the justification for our emotions more broadly, or our reactive attitudes in particular? If anything, these patterns are merely procedurally, rather than substantively, rational. This is because they determine only whether I ought to adopt emotions that have foci that are (in)consistent with the foci of other emotions to which I have already given weight. But they will not tell us anything about whether any particular emotion is, on its own, appropriate to have, nor will they provide us with an independent perspective from which to evaluate the norms from which the emotions gain their foci. Relatedly, in being only procedurally rational, emotions' rational patterns will also tell us nothing about which emotions to favor when they are in conflict with one another. These patterns will only highlight that such conflicts should be eradicated.

By way of conclusion, I would like to emphasize that this concern about emotions' rational patterns underscores the question of whether Helm's view entails a kind of relativism. Here, the worry is not only about the justification for the emotions and the reactive attitudes. It also concerns the justification for appealing to communities of respect and the shared norms in which they are purportedly grounded to determine what we ought to do and how we ought to act. Helm addresses this question in the final sub-section (section 8.3, "Towards Metaethics"). There he argues that although his aim has been to describe largely non-moral communities, he intends the basic structure of communities of respect to apply to the moral community and the attendant notions of responsibility, authority and dignity that are particular to the moral domain (p.237). In this regard, Helm's answer is that the plethora of communities of respect to which we belong are a necessary, but not sufficient, condition for the broader moral community of which we are all a part (rather than a source of irresolvable moral disagreements about which norms should ground our attributions of moral responsibility, authority and dignity). I take this answer as a promissory note, and I look forward to considering Helm's extension of his fascinating argument to the broader question of the moral community as such.

Philosophers interested in topics as wide-ranging as respect, the reactive attitudes, the sentimentalist account of emotions, practical rationality, shared agency and metaethics will find rich arguments with which to engage in this book. Although the idea that respect is fundamentally interpersonal (and grounded in interpersonal relationships) has a long history, Helm's account of the sense in which it is interpersonal, the way it is grounded (and thereby justified) and the subsequent grounding (but not viciously circular) role it plays is ambitious, innovative and challenging.


D'Arms, Justin and Jacobson, Daniel. (2000). The Moralistic Fallacy: On the 'Appropriateness' of Emotions. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 61 (1): 65-90.

Darwall, Stephen. (1977.) Two Kinds of Respect. Ethics 88: 36-49.

____. (2006). The Second-Person Standpoint: Morality, Respect, and Accountability. Harvard University Press.

Gilbert, Margaret. (2005). A Theory of Political Obligation: Membership, Commitment, and the Bonds of Society. Oxford University Press.

___. (2014). Joint Commitment: How We Make the Social World. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[1] Helm uses this example to illustrate his argument, although I think it is worth asking whether this strict distinction between ‘moral’ and ‘non-moral’ communities can be maintained.  Helm seems to assume that the only properly moral community is the one of all rational persons (p.22). This claim seems too strong, given that we may be members of smaller communities in which we have special moral obligations to other members (e.g., as in the case of our special obligations to family or friends).  

[2] Helm agrees with Darwall’s (1977; 2006) characterization of respect as “recognition respect,” which is the specific kind of regard we owe to others who have the standing and authority to make moral demands of us.  He simply expands the set of appropriate objects of respect to include the community itself and not merely its members.

[3] Helm notes that the sense in which these norms come to be binding for each us is not fully explained by theories of joint commitment, such as that defended by Margaret Gilbert (2006; 2014).

[4] Although this example does not directly illustrate the latter, it gestures toward an answer to this question for weightier cases (such as the warrant for blame), as I discuss below. 

[5] For a discussion of a related worry about fitting attitude views, see D’Arms and Jacobson (2000: n. 16).