Comparative Essays in Early Greek and Chinese Rational Thinking

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Jean-Paul Reding, Comparative Essays in Early Greek and Chinese Rational Thinking, Ashgate, 2004, 229pp, $99.95 (hbk), ISNB 0754638030.

Reviewed by Bryan W. Van Norden, Vassar College


Philosophers who compare Western philosophy with Indian philosophy or Buddhism are generally struck by the similarity between the former and the latter. Issues about personal identity, metaphysics, etc. are easily identified cross-culturally. (See, e.g., Jay Garfield's Empty Words [New York: Oxford University Press, 2001].) In contrast, those who compare Western and Chinese philosophy are generally struck by the differences: formal logic never developed in China; metaphor seems to be emphasized over more rigorous argument forms in China; deductive geometry became a model for philosophical method in the West but not in China; no work with concerns similar to Aristotle's Metaphysics became a paradigm of Chinese philosophy; atomism arose in the West but not in China.

It is tempting to explain at least some of these differences via the Sapir-Worf hypothesis. The Indo-European languages of Western and Indian philosophy make heavy use of the verb to be, while the Sino-Tibetan language family to which Chinese belongs has no such verb. Charles Kahn has done some justly famous work in which he argues that the pre-philosophical Greek language had a salubrious influence on the development of Greek philosophy by linking existence, truth and predication via the verb einai (see Kahn, The Verb Be in Ancient Greek [Dordrecht: Reidel, 1973]). If he is right, Chinese philosophers would have been, at the least, discouraged by their very language from developing the metaphysical insights of Plato and Aristotle.

The brilliant sinologist A.C. Graham applied Kahn's argument to Classical Chinese. Graham supported Kahn's descriptive claim by showing that it is unclear how to directly translate a metaphysical work like Anselm's Ontological Argument into Classical Chinese (see " 'Being' in Western Philosophy Compared with shi/fei and you/wu in Chinese Philosophy" in Graham, Studies in Chinese Philosophy and Philosophical Literature [Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990], pp. 322-359). However, Graham, who was more sympathetic to the anti-metaphysical strain in post-WWII British philosophy, turned Kahn's evaluative claim on its head: Chinese thinkers were fortunate, he thought, in not being seduced by the fallacies of Western metaphysical thinking.

The prima facie differences between Chinese and Western philosophy require extensive qualification, though. Hu Shih noted that the long-neglected Later Mohist writings (c. 300 BCE) include careful arguments and discuss issues in dialectics and the philosophy of language, often dealing with themes familiar to Western philosophers (see Hu, The Development of the Logical Method in Ancient China, 2nd ed. [New York: Paragon Book Reprint Corp., 1963]). The Mohists also show an interest in geometry and seem to give a quasi-geometrical presentation of their ideas (see Graham, Disputers of the Tao [Chicago: Open Court Press, 1989], pp. 137-170). True, neither the Mohists nor anyone else in China developed formal logic. But Parmenides, Socrates and Plato did philosophy without needing to wait around for Aristotle's Organon. And most philosophy since Aristotle has not been conducted in syllogisms anyway. Finally, recent work has revealed the extent to which careful rational argumentation is present in Confucian and Taoist texts, once their intellectual context and technical vocabulary is understood. (See, e.g., Xiusheng Liu and Philip J. Ivanhoe, eds., Essays on the Moral Philosophy of Mengzi [Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 2002], Paul Kjellberg and Philip J. Ivanhoe, eds., Essays on Skepticism, Relativism and Ethics in the Zhuangzi [Albany: State University of New York Press, 1996], and Thornton Kline and Philip J. Ivanhoe, eds., Virtue, Nature and Moral Agency in the Xunzi [Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 2000].)

In this collection of essays (most previously published, but often revised), Jean-Paul Reding continues the project of identifying similar issues and arguments between Western (specifically Greek) and Chinese philosophy. In addition, Reding calls for a re-evaluation of the Sapir-Worf hypothesis. He accepts that language influences the development of philosophy. However, he argues that we see by comparing Chinese and Greek thinkers that philosophers often reach very similar insights despite using very different languages. He also argues that many of the differences in emphasis we see between Chinese and Western philosophy are due to the fact that Greek philosophers are—very self-consciously—attempting to overcome the conceptual structure of their own language, which they see as an impediment to clear philosophical thinking.

Reding directly challenges Kahn and Graham in " 'To Be' in Greece and China." Against Kahn, Reding argues that einai (to be), far from encouraging fruitful metaphysical thought, was seen as a philosophically confused and confusing word by the Greeks themselves. Thus Aristotle is forced to identify misleading uses of the verb in order to combat certain sophistries: "For it is not the same thing 'not to be something' and 'not to be' absolutely; but, owing to the similarity of language, 'to be something' appears to differ only a little from 'to be,' and 'not to be something' from 'not to be'" (Sophistical Refutations 167a1-8, cited on p. 174). Kahn would, I think, acknowledge that Greek ordinary language required conceptual clarification. However, he could nonetheless maintain that einai pointed in the right general direction, even if it pointed vaguely.

More decisive is Reding's response to Graham's demonstration that Western metaphysical text cannot be directly translated into Classical Chinese: he observes that "the Greek language—as a natural, non-philosophical language—could not express these new concepts either, but had first to be changed by the philosophers" (p. 186).

Reding defends two positive theses in this essay. First, there "is a formal resemblance between the Greek and the Chinese approaches to the notion of being, in the sense that both cultures had hit upon the same paradoxes" (p. 189). "The same paradoxes" seems a bit too strong, but Reding does show Chinese thinkers wrestling with issues similar to those familiar to Western metaphysicians. For instance, Gongsun Long's "Treatise on Referring to Things" begins, "Things never fail to be referents, but referring is not a referent. É Referring does not exist. Things do exist. It is not possible to regard what does exist as what does not exist. If referring does not exist, then things cannot be called referents. That which cannot be called a referent is not a referent." (Cf. p. 181, where Reding cites another passage from the same treatise.)

Reding's second positive thesis is that, even though Classical Chinese uses a variety of expressions for what is expressed by forms of "to be" in Greek, we see a similar linkage of truth, predication and existence. When Mengzi asks a king whether a certain story is true, what he literally says is, "Is it there?" and the king's answer is, "It is there." A negative nominal construction in Chinese uses fei ("is-not"), but fei can also mean "to regard as false." Chinese philosophers could have exploited such connections for metaphysical purposes, had they wished to.

In "Greek and Chinese Categories," one of the best essays in the collection, Reding disputes Benveniste's claim that Aristotle's categories are merely a projection of his language (Benveniste, Problems in General Linguistics [Coral Gables: University of Miami Press, 1971]), and Graham's claim that Chinese thinkers would have (because of the difference of Chinese from Greek) constructed radically different categories had they been interested in the issue at all (Graham, Disputers of the Tao, pp. 414-428). Reding shows, through careful and thoughtful exegesis, that Aristotle's metaphysical categories explicitly cut across grammatical categories. Thus, "to recover" looks grammatically like it refers to something in the category of action. (In Greek it ends in –ein, the infinitive marker of many action verbs.) But it actually belongs in the category of states. Part of Aristotle's concern with these categories has to do with the effort to combat philosophical confusions and sophistries. We see a very similar concern in many Chinese texts. The Later Mohists observe, "Different kinds are not comparable. É Which is longer, a piece of wood or a night? Which do you have more of, knowledge or grain?" (p. 89). The Mohists do not generate a specific list of categories, but clearly seem interested in warning against sophistries that result from what we would call categorical distinctions: "Name and object do not necessarily go together. If this stone is white, when you break up this stone, all of it is the same as the white thing; but although this stone is big, it is not the same as the big thing" (p. 90).

In "Light and Mirror in Greece and China: Elements of Comparative Metaphorology," Reding notes the ironical situation that Plato and Aristotle regard metaphors as second-rate tools for expressing the truth, yet they frequently invent metaphors. In contrast, Chinese thinkers express no qualms about metaphors, but often use repeatedly the same metaphors. Reding ingeniously suggests that Greek thinkers are dubious about the philosophical adequacy of ordinary language, and this is precisely what legitimates the use of metaphors to point beyond what language can express. In contrast, Chinese thinkers tend to be more sanguine about the adequacy of ordinary language. But if this is so, why resort to metaphors at all? The answer lies in a fundamental difference between Chinese and Western metaphors. Western metaphors typically draw a correspondence between two ontologically distinct domains. For example, I open a "file" on my computer's "desktop." This is a brilliant way of conceptualizing a complex process, but we don't think there is any metaphysical connection between paper file folders on a wooden desk and the images on my computer screen. But try to apply this conception of metaphor to the famous debate between the Confucian Mengzi and the rival philosopher Gaozi (see Philip J. Ivanhoe and Bryan W. Van Norden, eds., Readings in Classical Chinese Philosophy [Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 2003], p. 140-141). Gaozi says that human nature is like water. Just as water will equally well flow east or west depending on its environment, so will humans become good or bad depending on their environment. Mengzi acknowledges that water is indifferent between east and west, but observes that it does show a preference for low over high. One can force water to go uphill, but given a natural environment it will flow down. This exchange has puzzled and disappointed many interpreters, who see in the clash of metaphors empty rhetoric. However, Chinese thinkers often assume what has been called a "correlative cosmology," according to which superficially diverse phenomena manifest the same qualitative patterns. Thus, "the Chinese metaphor does not try to establish a parallelism between two domains, but rather wants to show that there is a convergence between them: the nature of water behaves in exactly the same way as the nature of man" (p. 136, emphasis in original). Gaozi's initial water metaphor is supposed to be compelling because both water and human beings have a "nature" (xing in Chinese). However, Mengzi points out, quite correctly, that Gaozi has failed to explain how his view accounts for the natural dispositions of either water or human nature. Reding also notes in this article that in both ancient China and Greece, we see the metaphors of knowledge-is-seeing and knowing-is-mirroring.

Reding continues his discussion of metaphors in "The Origin of Logic in China," where he suggests that metaphors can be a way of highlighting the logical structure of an argument without explicitly stating an abstract, deductively valid schema. For example, in response to someone who believes that there are no spirits, but still advocates practicing the sacrificial rites to the ancestors, Mozi replies, "Study the sacrificial rites while affirming that there are no spirits, É this is like knotting nets while there are no fish" (35). Reding suggests that Mozi is using the metaphor to suggest a reductio ad absurdum with the following logical structure: (1) P if and only if Q. (2) P and not-Q. Therefore, Q and not-Q. This is intriguing, but Reding's analysis is hampered by a failure to use logical formalism with sufficient care. Mozi clearly would not want to commit himself to a truth-functional interpretation of what he had said. It simply is not true that "People knot nets if and only if they believe there are fish" (I believe at this very moment that "there are fish," but I'm writing a review, not knotting a net), nor is it true that "People study sacrificial rites if and only if they believe there are spirits" (since the whole point of the argument is that Mozi's opponent does practice the rites yet does not believe there are spirits). Mozi is arguing that there is a practical contradiction in his opponent's position, not a logical one. (Ironically, Reding seems to make this point regarding the very same argument in a different essay [p. 27].) Another study that emphasizes the use of metaphor in Chinese thought, but with a methodology different from Reding's, is Edward Slingerland's Effortless Action (New York: Oxford University Press, 2003).

In " 'Contradiction is Impossible,' " Reding argues that we see in both Greece and China thinkers proposing and arguing against the sophistry that it is impossible for two people to disagree or contradict one another. Plato wrestles with this problem in the Euthydemus, and Aristotle in the Metaphysics (Book 5, Chapter 29). The Later Mohists seem to argue against a similar sophistry: "To say that there is no winner in disputation necessarily does not fit the fact." They distinguish a case of purely verbal disagreement ("one man calls it 'whelp' and the other 'dog' ") from one in which they genuinely say different things ("one man calls it 'ox' and the other 'horse'"). They conclude, "In disputation, the one calls it as it is, the other one, not. The one who fits the fact wins the debate" (cited on p. 19; my analysis of this passage differs somewhat from Reding's).

I worry, though, that Reding overestimates the exigency of this issue in China. He cites Zhuangzi's argument:

Let us suppose that you and I argue. If you beat me, and not I you, are you in the end right and I wrong? If I beat you and not you me, am I then in the end right and you wrong? Or is one of us right, and the other wrong? Or are we both right or both wrong? ÉWho shall I employ as arbiter between us? If I employ someone who takes your view to decide, how can he arbitrate between us, since he already sides with you? If I employ someone who takes my view to decide, how can he arbitrate between us, since he already sides with me? (Cited on p. 20; for the full passage see Ivanhoe and Van Norden, p. 218.)

The sentence "Or are we both right or both wrong?" may very well make oblique reference to the sophistry that interests Reding, but I read the passage as primarily a (rather powerful) skeptical argument based on the epistemological inconclusiveness of victory in debate and the impossibility of finding a neutral perspective from which to evaluate arguments.

I am also concerned that Reding underemphasizes the extent to which the sophistry is tied in Greece to particular metaphysical issues inherited from Parmenides. The Greeks connect falsehood with saying what is-not, and are puzzled how this could even be possible. But whether one agrees with all the details or not, this article is a thought-provoking discussion of comparative paradox-ology.

In "Words for Atoms—Atoms for Words," Reding discusses the fact that atomism developed in Greece but not in China. He suggests that both Greek and Chinese thinkers would agree with the principle ex nihilo nihil. (How disappointing they would have found the vacuum fluctuations of quantum mechanics!) This principle only generates a problem for Greek philosophers, though, because of the language they use. As Anaxagoras complains, "The Greeks are wrong to recognise coming into being and perishing; for nothing comes into being nor perishes, but is rather compounded or dissolved from things that are. So they would be right to call coming into being composition and perishing dissolution" (350 KRS, cited on p. 107). The ordinary language of change makes it seem paradoxical, thereby stimulating the development of a philosophical theory like atomism, which explains how apparent change is possible, when ultimately nothing comes into being or passes away.

In contrast, Reding surveys Chinese words for change and shows that all of them assume transformation of what already exists: hua (to metamorphosize), sheng (to be born from something), si (to die and become inanimate), cun (to persist), wang (to suffer dissolution), sun (to increase), yi (to decrease), bian (to alter), yi (to exchange). The Later Mohists, presenting what they take to be the ordinary language senses of these words, define almost all of them in terms of yi (to exchange). Thus, a metamorphosis occurs when "the distinguishing marks of one thing [are] exchanged for the distinguishing marks of another" (p. 120); e.g. when a caterpillar becomes a butterfly). In short, Reding suggests that the Chinese language embodies the principle ex nihilo nihil, whereas the Greek language violates it, motivating the Greek philosophers to construct theories to "fix" their language: "What is philosophical in one culture may be already lexicalized in another, and what is lexicalized in one culture may turn up as a philosophical theory in another" (p. 125).

Reding's "Philosophy and Geometry in Early China" is not too surprising to those of us already familiar with the Later Mohist writings, but it may shock those with stereotypical preconceptions about Chinese philosophy. It is a truism that deductive geometry became one of the major paradigms for philosophical methodology in the West (even though it may not be as simple historically as deductive geometry developing first and then influencing philosophy). It is tempting to identify this as a categorical difference between Western and Chinese philosophy (especially if one is only familiar with Confucianism and Taoism). However, the Later Mohists showed a definite interest in geometry, giving definitions of terms such as "point" ("the unit without dimension which precedes all others") and "circle" ("having the same lengths from one centre"). Ethical terms are handled similarly: "Harm is what one dislikes getting"; "Benefit is what one is pleased to get"; "To be righteous is to benefit." Reding's conclusion is properly cautious, though: "it seems as if the Later Mohists never made the decisive step from definition to [geometrical] demonstration" (p. 64).

Overall, this is a provocative and often insightful book. Anyone interested in Chinese-Greek comparative philosophy should give it at least a quick read. I wish, though, that Reding had stressed more the historical importance of Parmenides and Plato as individual thinkers. (Forgive me if I sound too sympathetic to Thomas Carlyle's heroic view of history.) The Greek language may have encouraged philosophers to find paradoxes in questions about being and becoming. But it was the particular genius of Parmenides that, for good or ill, made those questions the center of philosophical discussion. Furthermore, the argumentative style that Parmenides employed greatly influenced philosophical methodology. As Reding notes, we see "sophistical" arguers in both ancient China and Greece, which led to a distrust of what seemed to be overly subtle reasoning. But Plato brilliantly carried on the Parmenidean style of argumentation and metaphysics, wedding them to an ethics, and giving them form through the eloquence of his dialogues. This helped, I think, to keep alive the belief that subtle argumentation was more than just eristic sophistry. Reding has an interesting tale to tell, but there would be no tale without Parmenides and Plato.