Complexity and the Arrow of Time

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Charles H. Lineweaver, Paul C. W. Davies, and Michael Ruse (eds.), Complexity and the Arrow of Time, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 357pp., $30.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107027251.

Reviewed by James Ladyman, University of Bristol


This is a rich collection of essays on various aspects of complexity science, and I strongly recommend it to philosophers interested in the frontiers of scientific thought about cosmology, evolution and information. Those interested in emergence and reduction will find much relevant material. There are many issues concerning complex systems that cry out for conceptual clarification, and popular and scientific discussions are replete with arguments in need of scrutiny. It is often said that what characterizes twenty-first century science is complexity and the failure of reductive methods, and that complex systems involve novel forms of emergence. Whether there is any truth to these claims is contestable, but there is no doubt that complexity science is philosophically significant. The focus of this book is that when biological complexity is considered, it seems that during the course of the history of life on Earth it has increased more or less monotonically, and similarly the complexity of the universe seems to have increased over time. Does complexity provide a new arrow of time? The trouble is questions about complexity and the arrow of time depend on questions about the fate of the universe as well as the fate of life on Earth, the answers to which we don't know.

Complex systems research is an offshoot of chaos theory, dynamical systems theory, cybernetics and control theory, information theory and networks analysis. It aims to describe systems of many different kinds that are composed of numerous interacting parts, with the aid of computer modeling and simulation. The science of complexity is already indispensible and is likely to be ever more important. Its conceptual foundations, however, are so extremely unclear that it is very difficult even to say what it is about because there is no agreed upon definition of complexity. Various measures have been proposed, and many of them are discussed in this book. However, while the editors explain that they set out to ask what complexity is and whether or not it is increasing, they make clear that the book does not answer their questions to their satisfaction.

Essence may elude us, but there are paradigmatic complex systems, chief among them living organisms, their parts, and collections of them, for example, cells, ant colonies, and the human brain. In the context of biology, complexity refers not only to structure and its formation and maintenance, but also to complex adaptive behaviour. The latter has given rise to the complex systems of human construction such as markets, the internet and traffic. Non-living complex systems include galaxies and various systems of condensed matter that are said to exhibit self-organising emergent behaviour. Whether there is a single concept of complexity that covers both living and non-living cases remains to be seen.

After the introduction, which offers a clear account of the main themes, the first section is about cosmology and physics in relation to complexity. In this context the relationship between the thermodynamic concepts of entropy and free energy on the one hand, and complexity on the other, are tantalizing. The universe as a whole seems to have become more and more complicated since its infancy when there were no stars or galaxies and no matter other than hydrogen, beryllium, lithium and helium. There are now three generations of stars, each with successively higher concentrations of heavier elements formed by nucleosynthesis in their ancestors. There are nearly one hundred elements found on Earth comprising nearly 5000 naturally occurring minerals, and including synthetic compounds there are about 60 million known chemicals. Physical complexity, like entropy, seems to have monotonically increased with time over the history of the universe. However, as Paul Davies points out in his essay, there is no agreed upon general definition of the entropy of the gravitational field, and it is perfectly possibly given our current state of knowledge that the complexity of the universe will decrease in the future if all matter ends up in black holes that then evaporate. Likewise, Davies thinks that biological complexity may await a similar fate.

Charles Lineweaver explores the idea that the creation of complexity is driven by free energy and argues that as the latter decreases with the increase of entropy, so too will complexity decrease as we head towards the heat death of the universe. The association of complexity with free energy is illustrated in the introduction by the fact that the order of a hurricane is associated with the large pressure, temperature and humidity gradients. Eric Chaisson proposes energy flow per unit time per unit mass as a measure of complexity and applies this idea to both non-living and living systems to argue that in both cases complexity has increased over time. Seth Lloyd argues that complexity results from quantum computation, making some big assumptions including the existence of multiverses and that complexity is measured by the notion of thermodynamic depth built on Charles Bennett's idea of logical depth. This rivalry between physical and computational measures of complexity occurs throughout debates about complexity science, as does nonlinear dynamics; Marcelo Gleiser applies non-linear field theory to the problem of characterising and explaining complexity.

The next section concerns biological complexity and includes fascinating reflections from influential figures such as Simon Conway Morris and Stuart Kauffman. Proposed measures of biological complexity include genome length, but W. C. Wimsatt discusses the subtler notion of generative entrenchment. Many ideas of complexity similarly have to do with the history of a system and/or its relation to its environment. The complexity and maintenance of biological structure seems to require a free energy gradient, and the latter is associated with the production of entropy. However, complexity involves order while increasing entropy is associated with randomness and disorder. David Wolpert offers a way to use the Second Law of Thermodynamics to explain complexity by measuring the latter with a notion of self-similarity at different scales. Eric Smith on the other hand analyses complexity in terms of the notions of memory and robustness that often figure in the science of complex systems. A flock of birds dispersed by a predator reforms and 'remembers' its trajectory despite lacking any overall controller. Smith connects this with the formalism of order parameters in statistical physics. But David Krakauer thinks of biological complexity in terms of the cognitive capacity of the organism to represent and predict its environment.

In the face of so many competing accounts of complexity some are very skeptical that the concept has much going for it. Michael Ruse discusses the history of debates about adaptation and complexity and progress in evolutionary biology, deflating the pretensions of complexity science, while the last essay, by Philip Clayton, adopts a highly pluralistic approach and rejects any unified theory of complexity.

There are two significant ironies in the rhetoric surrounding reductionism in discussions of complexity science in popular and philosophical commentary by both complexity scientists and others. The first is the fundamental reason complexity science exists is the success of the rest of science, that is to say, reductive science. For example, there would be no complexity science of the cell or the brain without biochemistry and electromagnetism. Furthermore, the techniques of complexity science would be impossible without computers, which themselves owe their success to the ultimate atomistic and reductionistic architecture of the circuit and the bit. Moreover, complexity science is inherently interdisciplinary linking different parts of existing science, and doing so in ways that depend on the existing knowledge of their domains.

While physics is much less simple than might have been hoped before knowledge of radioactivity and relativity theory, and far from reducing everything to matter in motion, arguably physics has refuted materialism and in its place we have at best a vaguer physicalism. Nonetheless, atomism did triumph in chemistry and led us to the more complex conception of the atomic world that we now have. Sui generis chemical and vital forces were not fecund for the development of explanatorily and predictively detailed and successful theories, and the pursuit of unity by building bridges between disciplines is one of the hallmarks of current science. The whole of natural science is based on the taxonomy of the periodic table of atomic structure, the fundamental forces and particles of the Standard Model, and the common system of scientific units. These theories and their experimental technologies are applied to everything from the early and distant universe to the human brain. Whether or not this vindicates strong forms of reductionism, it certainly means that there is something to the idea that every non-physical thing, such as a mind, depends on the physical stuff associated with it. The successful application of atomic and subatomic physics to chemistry and biology has made science highly unified and at least provides prima facie grounds for some kind of asymmetric supervenience of everything on the physical, weak as it may be. For many, of course, all this is very much understated, and we have good reason to be more or less eliminative reductionists.

However, even strong reductionists must concede that when it comes to epistemology and methodology, simple reductions seem unavailable. As Lineweaver, Davies and Ruse explain in their opening chapter, particle physics and Darwinian evolution respectively do not explain these putative facts, and moreover, assessing whether or not they are facts requires a quantitative measure of complexity, and while many have been proposed none of them have been widely accepted by workers in the field. Indeed, even an adequate qualitative account of complexity remains elusive. However, the second irony is the way complexity science works in practice, which is by breaking systems down into collections of interacting nodes. Far from being antireductionist, complexity science seeks to model, explain and predict emergent order in all kinds of systems by treating them as collections of parts, not as wholes. This is not to say that there are not fascinating kinds of emergence in complex systems. However, there is no reason to regard them as undermining physicalism, nor has enough been done to show that they are not compatible with ontic, as opposed to epistemic, reductionism.

The authors of the contributions to this volume operate with different conceptions of complexity and apply them to different areas, and there is little agreement among them about fundamental issues. Philosophers may find the subject frustrating, and one thing that characterizes the field is the extension of concepts and theories beyond the context in which their applicability is established. The book does not answer the questions about the nature of complexity and the arrow of time it raises, but it does contain a wealth of science and lots of interesting ideas.