Conceptions of Parenthood: Ethics and the Family

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Michael W. Austin, Conceptions of Parenthood: Ethics and the Family, Ashgate Publishing, 2007, 138pp., $99.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780754658382.

Reviewed by Joseph Millum, National Institutes of Health


Parenthood is not just a biological or social fact, but a normative relationship.[1] It is the source of unique and important values, and it grounds special claims and responsibilities. It is also a relationship that generates some vexing moral problems. One set concerns who the parents are. For example, new technologies mean that the egg of one woman can be fertilized in a laboratory with an anonymous donor's sperm and then gestated by another woman. Which woman is the mother? And what relationship, if any, does the sperm donor have to the child? Another set of problems concerns the content of the parents' rights and duties. For example, is it acceptable to raise one's child in a particular religion, or decline medical treatment for her on religious grounds? May parents send their children to private schools, even if this reinforces social inequalities? Indeed, do they actually have a duty to privilege their children if they can? In Conceptions of Parenthood Michael W. Austin develops a theory of parenthood intended to answer such questions.

The structure of the book is straightforward. Austin starts with what he argues are unsuccessful conceptions of parenthood, that is, mistaken accounts of the source of moral parenthood. He then outlines three successful conceptions, which he believes correctly identify grounds for parental rights or responsibilities, and subsumes them under his own ostensibly pluralistic "stewardship" view. On this view, parents are just looking after their child -- on behalf of both the child and society -- until such time as the child can look after herself. He develops the stewardship view into an account not just of the acquisition, but also the content, of parental rights and responsibilities. Along the way he applies his theory by considering a variety of important ethical questions, such as those mentioned above. As this summary suggests, despite its small size, Conceptions of Parenthood covers a lot of ground. There is therefore much more in the book than this short review can consider; I confine myself to some critical remarks on Austin's theory of moral parenthood.

The core argument of the book begins with Austin's defense of the three "successful" conceptions of parenthood, each of which gives a way in which he thinks people can become moral parents. According to the first -- the "custodial relationship" conception -- the ascription of rights and responsibilities to custodial parents is justified by the interests both adults and children have in the continuation of healthy caretaking relationships. This is the only conception, Austin claims, that justifies parental rights.[2] In light of this, it is disappointing that he does not provide a more detailed explanation of this justification. Indeed, what counts as a custodial relationship is not at all clear. In dealing with a case of disputed parenthood between a surrogate and the woman who contracted with her, Austin claims that the surrogate has a custodial relationship with the child, Jaycee, because she carried her, and the contracting parent also has a custodial relationship, "because she has gone to great lengths to bring Jaycee into existence, and it is plausible to think she has a deep relational attachment to Jaycee as her mother" (34). This is an unorthodox use of the term 'custodial,' whose proper application in this context thereby appears obscure. It is therefore not possible to assess the truth of the custodial conception.

Being involved in a custodial relationship is the only way Austin thinks one can obtain parental rights, but there are two other ways to acquire parental responsibilities. One is the uncontroversial "consent" conception, according to which people get the responsibilities by voluntarily taking them on. However, Austin notes, neither consent nor custody explain some cases in which we are confident that people are responsible for a child. Consider a man who unintentionally impregnated his sexual partner (say because their contraception failed). He might have known about this risk and so known that there was a non-zero probability that sex would result in a child, but such recognition is a far cry from consent to care for the child. Still, we hold such men responsible. In order to take account of such cases, Austin defends a "causal conception" of parenthood, according to which a moral agent who voluntarily causes the existence of a child, in the relevant way, has parental responsibilities towards that child.

Such causalist accounts of how parental responsibilities are acquired run into two standard objections. First, they contradict a key principle that emerged from the debate that followed Judith Jarvis Thomson's 'A Defense of Abortion.'[3] Defenders of Thomson's view argued that merely being the voluntary cause of the existence of a being with morally important needs is insufficient to give an agent a duty to meet those needs. Consequently, insofar as the duties of parents are duties to meet their children's morally important needs, they cannot derive simply from voluntarily causing their children to exist. Austin acknowledges and engages with the extensive literature on this issue, though his discussion is unlikely to convince those who think Thomson is correct.

The second major concern about causalist theories is that we need some explanation of why some agents who cause the existence of a child have special responsibilities to her, and others do not. For example, a man who conceives through consensual intercourse has parental responsibilities, but a technician who fertilizes an egg in a laboratory does not, and neither does the matchmaker who brings a couple together. Austin recognizes this problem, too, but he deals with it by definitional fiat. He proposes to use a "commonsense notion of causation which takes genetic (and perhaps gestational) parents to be the primary and proximate causes of the existence of their children and rules out those individuals who make important causal contributions to a child's existence, such as health care professionals" (39). Certainly, such a notion will identify exactly those individuals whom we pre-reflectively think are the parents, but it then does no explanatory work at all -- we are still left wondering why being one of these causes, rather than another type of cause, makes a difference to someone's duties.

Following his discussion of the routes to moral parenthood, Austin turns to the content of his stewardship view. If parents are stewards, this implies that they are looking after something valuable on behalf of another (or others). Consequently, one appealing feature of Austin's account is that it makes sense of two sorts of obligations that parents may be thought to have. First, we commonly think that parents have obligations to society to bring their children up to be good citizens. Second, we may think they have obligations to the child in virtue of the adult she is expected to become: parents should raise their child to become a flourishing adult, and gradually cede to her control over her life as she develops towards adulthood.

Having argued for three ways in which we can become moral parents, it would be natural to demonstrate how these ways explain the content of parental rights and responsibilities. It would be interesting, for example, to see why Austin thinks that the responsibilities generated by being in a custodial relationship with a child and the responsibilities generated by causing a child's existence are the same, that is, why both imply that parents are "stewards" of their children. He does not do this. Instead, he ceases to discuss the successful conceptions and turns his attention instead to cashing out the stewardship view in terms of the interests of parents and children.

The content of parental responsibilities follows quite naturally from conceiving of parents as stewards of their children. Austin argues that "[t]he primary moral obligation of parents to their children is to raise them in such a way that they have sufficient opportunity to experience significant well-being over the course of their lives" (109). This means that parents have negative obligations to avoid abuse, neglect, and indoctrination, and positive obligations to promote their children's autonomy and moral development, and to pursue intimate and loving relationships with their children. He also thinks that parental rights follow from the stewardship relationship. This works well for those parental rights that are claims against others not to interfere with on-going successful parenting. It is less convincing as a way of understanding those rights that do not automatically coincide with the welfare of the child. In such cases it is more plausible to think that parents are permitted to balance their stewardship responsibilities against other considerations because the parents have rights of their own.

Austin ultimately grounds parental rights in the fundamental interests of both parents and children. Fundamental interests are things that are "crucially important to human life" (77). Their importance grounds a claim against others that they not interfere with an individual's pursuit of these interests. For example, there is a unique and important good to be gained from the process of guiding the development of a child; parents can realize this good only if they are allowed the freedom to make parental decisions, rather than being told what to do. Likewise, both parents and their children need a protected sphere of interaction in which to foster an intimate parent-child relationship. The importance of these goods, Austin claims, implies that the parents may rightly take their own interests into account in making decisions about their children's lives. So, for example, parents have a prima facie right to raise their children within their religious framework, and this right is justified not just because sharing a religion with her parents may be beneficial to the child, but because her parents' own welfare may be affected by it.

The argument defending the existence of (limited) parental rights is persuasive; however, Austin's application of his view to particular cases is less compelling. Rights are supposed to constrain the permissible ways in which individuals or the state may act, even if acting in a certain way would produce better results than any alternative. But Austin seems to resolve moral dilemmas about the limits of parental discretion by simply weighing the different interests at stake. This disregards the complex ways in which the parental rights he has argued for may interact with the rights and interests of children. For example, after a quite sensible discussion of the limits of medical decision-making, Austin concludes:

What is important for and counts in favor of the stewardship view of parental rights that I have argued for in this chapter is that it allows for all of these interests to be considered in cases of medical decision-making, so that the interests of neither parents, nor their children, nor the state automatically carry the most weight. (102)

It is true that there are many interests at stake in medical decision-making; it does not follow that they should all be acknowledged. For instance, we may reasonably ask why the interests of the parents should count for anything. Why think that their fundamental interests in parenting require rights that extend to making medical decisions that undermine their children's welfare at all? And why not think that the rights of children are sufficiently strong to override anyone else's mere interest in denying them care? Of course, there may be good answers to these questions, but they are not fully addressed in this book.

This criticism points to the central weakness of Conceptions of Parenthood: Austin does an excellent job of collecting intuitions about parenthood, but he does not provide a compelling systematization of them. His stewardship account explains our intuitions about moral parenthood at the cost of vagueness about its content. This vagueness means that the account cannot do much work to resolve disagreements about parenthood. Indeed, Austin's interpretation of his own theory too often seems to be driven by his intuitions about cases, not by the considerations that justify the theory.

[1] The opinions expressed in this review are the author's own. They do not reflect any position or policy of the National Institutes of Health, U.S. Public Health Service, or Department of Health and Human Services.

[2] There is an apparent inconsistency here. At one point Austin does state that "any person who acquires parental obligations to a child has a defeasible rights-claim to that child" (57). However, this claim is not explored in any detail. Elsewhere, when discussing the other two successful conceptions of parenthood, Austin argues that consent (37) and standing in the appropriate causal relationship (56) are sufficient only for parental obligations, not for parental rights. I take this to be his settled opinion.

[3] Judith Jarvis Thomson, "A Defense of Abortion," Philosophy and Public Affairs Vol. 1 No. 1 (Fall 1971): 47-66.