Concepts and Reality in the History of Philosophy: Tracing a Philosophical Error from Locke to Bradley

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Ellis, Fiona, Concepts and Reality in the History of Philosophy: Tracing a Philosophical Error from Locke to Bradley, Routledge, 2005, 173pp, £60 (hbk), ISBN 0415334780.

Reviewed by Robert Stern, University of Sheffield


Although the philosophical approach of diagnosis, therapy and dissolution is most commonly associated with Wittgenstein, there is good reason to claim that it was pioneered by Hegel. For, Hegel learned from Kant's transcendental dialectic that apparently insoluble philosophical problems may be thrown up because aspects of our thinking lead us astray; but rather than agreeing with Kant that these problems are inescapable because we are always drawn to those ways of thinking, Hegel argued that the latter can be transformed, thereby rendering tractable the issues that otherwise would remain irresolvable by us. Faced with a philosophical difficulty, therefore, where the opposed options for dealing with it both seem equally unsatisfactory, the Hegelian approach is to step back and ask what common assumption we have made that has led to this impasse, in the hope that once this assumption is removed, a way out of the difficulty can be attained, and the problem resolved. Bringing such assumptions to the light of day is what the process of diagnosis and therapy hopes to achieve, and with it the dissolution of the problem that cannot be settled by either side 'head on', within the existing range of alternatives.

Hegel, no less than Wittgenstein, was fully aware, however, that this approach can be hard to pull off, primarily because philosophical disputes by their nature run deep, so that these 'blind spots' can be hard to uncover and make visible to the partisans in the debate; unless it is done properly, the proposed dissolution will seem too quick, and neither side will feel that proper account has been taken of where the real difficulties lie. It therefore takes a particular kind of philosophical genius to make this technique work successfully.

In her book Concepts and Reality in the History of Philosophy, Fiona Ellis attempts a project of this kind, in a way that takes Hegel as her inspiration, both in terms of the diagnostic approach she adopts, and in terms of the particular therapy she prescribes (which she distinguishes from a more quietistic, Wittgensteinian form, familiar from the recent work of John McDowell). Ellis's aim, as she states in her subtitle, is to trace 'a philosophical error from Locke to Bradley', where the error in question is our tendency to oppose the way in which we conceptualise things in our experience and thought to the world as it really is, and where this error comes about because we divide our concepts off from reality. This then sets up a familiar oscillation: either we close the gap between ourselves and the world by being idealists about the latter, but then face compromising our common-sense realism; or we can remain true to our realism, but face the worry that reality is not how we experience it to be, given that experience is mediated by our concepts. Simplifying somewhat, Ellis takes Locke as representative of a realism that leads to scepticism, and Berkeley of an anti-scepticism that leads to idealism, where neither position can really be taken as satisfactory (as can be seen in part, Ellis argues, in various inconsistencies she adduces in their own positions, where each vainly struggles to incorporate aspects of the other side). She then considers the positions of Nietzsche and Kant (in that order), as attempts to resolve the oscillation in a more sophisticated way, by in effect trying to retain elements of realism within a picture that is still committed to perspectivalism or a form of idealism. Like many before her, however, Ellis is ultimately unsatisfied with these proposed compromises, as for both Nietzsche and Kant (she argues) reality in itself remains inaccessible, so that a residual sceptical worry remains.

The only satisfactory way out, Ellis argues, is provided by Hegel, who uncovers and questions the assumption that causes the problem in the first place: namely, that reality is radically distinct from the conceptual structure that we employ in thinking about it. Ellis puts the alternative Hegelian picture this way (using a metaphor she borrows from David Wiggins):

The idea that things in themselves are revealed in our concepts stands opposed to the picture according to which conceptualization is a matter of distortion. Hence it is inappropriate to present this position by means of the kind of metaphor which accompanies the position against which it is defined -- a metaphor according to which conceptualization is a matter of imposing shape upon formless matter, or, more radically, upon nothing at all. The alternative is to utilize a metaphor which captures the sense in which conceptualization involves revelation rather than distortion. One such metaphor is that of the fishnet. According to this metaphor, conceptualization is a matter of fishing, and the things we conceptualize are the things we catch in our nets when we go fishing. The main point behind this metaphor is to lend emphasis to the idea that although one can only think about objects one has concepts for, these objects can be there anyway, there being no implication that the activity of conceptualization serves to distort or to construct their natures (p. 52).

This is the kind of position Ellis wants to attribute to Hegel, and as evidence she cites his criticism of Kant and the 'Consciousness' section of the Phenomenology. At the same time, she resists readings of Hegel that would assimilate him to the more idealist pole of the oscillation, and she rejects claims that Hegel's theory of truth means that (like Bradley) he holds that the gap between the mind and the world can only be overcome non-conceptually, with 'thought's happy suicide'.

There is much that I agree with in Ellis's interpretation of the figures she discusses, and with the approach that she wants to take and defend regarding the relation between concepts and reality, which I think shows great wisdom. In fact, her position will be fairly familiar to anyone who knows the current literature on Hegel, while it also has parallels in the wider contemporary discussion in epistemology and metaphysics; it is perhaps a weakness of Ellis's book that she gives this insufficient acknowledgement, for while (as we have seen) Wiggins gets a mention and McDowell some discussion, there is no reference to the interpretative tradition on Hegel that has already explored the sort of approach she adopts, and in more depth and detail than she herself provides.

A more important criticism, however, is that as an exercise in diagnosis, therapy and dissolution, this book risks being seen as unsatisfactory; for it fails to enter deeply enough into the philosophical arguments that have driven philosophers to adopt the dualistic framework that Ellis wants to expunge, by treating this dualism as a mere 'blind spot' or unquestioned assumption. Let me briefly mention two examples where this problem arises.

As anyone who has read Kant's first Critique will know, a motivating worry here is the problem of synthetic a priori knowledge, where the issue for Kant is to explain how such knowledge is possible. Kant's answer, of course, is the Copernican revolution, and the claim that fundamental features of objects as we experience them derive from our mode of intuition and conceptualisation. But then, as Kant put it in the letter to Herz of 1772: '[i]f such intellectual representations depend on our inner activity, whence comes the agreement they are supposed to have with objects -- how do they agree with these objects, since the agreement has not been reached with the aid of experience?' Kant's response to this question is that this agreement is explicable only if we do not take the objects of which we have knowledge to be things as they are in themselves; for if we do, then the capacity of such intellectual representations to conform to such things becomes a mystery, only resolvable by appeal to some implausible notion of pre-established harmony between reality as it is in itself and the conceptual structure we bring to bear on it independently -- where this independence is required (Kant thinks) to explain our capacity for synthetic a priori knowledge. Now, I do not want to say that Kant is right to set things up here the way he does, or that his approach is the only one to take on these issues: on the contrary, there are many ways of criticising the Kantian position. But to do so, one must do more than simply point to the fact that the position with which Kant ends up is dualistic, and that this dualism creates problems for him in balancing his idealism with his realism; for the argument driving the Kantian position has some force, and needs more careful handling than Ellis herself provides.

A second issue where I think Ellis fails to make her Hegelian position compelling concerns her response to the Nietzschean worry that conceptualisation is inherently distortive because concepts involve generality, whereas entities in the world are individual. This theme, of course, has been enormously significant in the history of philosophy, both before Nietzsche and after him, where the entire tradition of 'continental' thought has raised this worry in various forms, from Schelling, Feuerbach and Kierkegaard, to Derrida and Deleuze. Ellis's response to this issue is mainly a diagnostic one, of insisting that Nietzsche's position here is aporetic, because he also rejects the Kantian notion of things in themselves as an inaccessible realm; but (Ellis argues) this stands in tension with his claims concerning the distortive nature of concepts. However, this appears to overlook a considerable difference between the Nietzschean and Kantian positions: for, while it is arguable that Kant did make things in themselves inaccessible to us, Nietzsche can avoid such a position, because he held that while they may be inaccessible via our concepts (because these are distortive), they can still be accessible in a non-conceptual manner, through a kind of direct experience. Now, of course, the Hegelian will be scornful of any such appeals to an experience that is somehow prior to or independent of conceptualisation; but I think he must also counter the central concern here, which is that concepts are inherently general, so that unless we have some non-conceptual experience, we could not grasp the individuality of things. It is a standard suspicion of Hegel that he does not take such individuality seriously, but by failing to address that suspicion, and the deep issues that it raises, it seems to me that Ellis fails to settle the problem properly, and lay this debate to rest. To do so, I believe, Ellis would have to engage closely with Hegel's Logic (a text she scarcely mentions), and his treatment of the concrete universal, together with the criticisms of that notion that come after Hegel.

Thus, while I am very much in sympathy with Ellis's general outlook, and some of her interpretative claims, I do not feel that her project ultimately succeeds in its goal of putting right the error she detects. As a therapist, albeit an Hegelian rather than Wittgensteinian one, she is too much above the fray, and this leads her to treat as a presupposition what is more often a conclusion driven by argument; by failing to face up to those arguments, she makes it hard to see how her treatment can be effective or resolve the dualism between thought and world in the way that she hopes.