Concepts of Sharedness: Essays on Collective Intentionality

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Hans Bernhard Schmid, Katinka Schulte-Ostermann, and Nikos Psarros (eds.), Concepts of Sharedness: Essays on Collective Intentionality, Ontos, 2008, 306pp., €89.00, ISBN 9783938793961.

Reviewed by Peter Tramel, USMA, West Point


This anthology contains a broad selection of papers by excellent social philosophers and philosophers of action. The papers were selected from among those given at the Fifth Conference on Collective Intentionality, held at the University of Helsinki in 2006. Some of the papers, and parts of some of the others, were published elsewhere before or since the conference. The editors provide brief summaries of the papers in an efficient introduction which selectively interested readers will find helpful.

The volume is divided into three parts. Part I -- Shared Attitudes -- contains four papers on the phenomenology of collective intentionality; Part II -- Analyzing Sharedness -- contains five papers on concepts in the theory of collective intentionality; Part III -- Sharedness and Normativity -- contains five papers on the normative implications of various claims in the theory of collective intentionality.

Wittgenstein famously asked: "What remains if I subtract the fact that my arm went up from the fact that I raised my arm?" The question vividly illustrates the importance of intention in action theory. Following Wittgenstein, David P. Schweikard (Part II, first essay) poses the question: "What remains if I subtract the fact that two people walked alongside each other from the fact that they walked together?" (91) Does there remain, for instance, a collective intention? If so, how is it collective, or shared, and how is it an intention? Does the action have a collective subject? Does it involve a collective mode of intention in the individuals -- an intending as a we rather than as a me? Does it involve a collective content? Would any of the answers change if we changed the example -- say to something necessarily done together, like tangoing or playing on a soccer team, or to serving as a functionary in an externally sanctioned structure, like a university or a limited liability corporation? What are the normative implications of the various ways we might answer questions like these? These are some of the central questions addressed by the essays in this volume.

Seminal to most of the essays is previous work by several thinkers not included in the volume, especially Michael Bratman, Margaret Gilbert, Philip Pettit, and John Searle. Every essay engages the relevant views of some or all of them. For readers without any prior acquaintance with the rapidly growing literature on collective intentionality, it may help to read out of order. I am such a reader and I think that I might have done a bit better to begin with the first three essays in Part II. In combination these give a great overview of the omni-relevant views of Bratman, Gilbert, Pettit, and Searle, and they provide a strong sense of the relevant conceptual territory. But I would advise no one who begins with Part II to miss Part I, which is very worthwhile.

In the first essay, Raimo Tuomela distinguishes "I-mode" from "We-mode" intending. He argues that the crux of the difference is that We-mode agents "jointly accept that the intention expression "We will bring about X," satisfying the Collectivity Condition, is true of them collectively (and also individually … )". (15) To satisfy the "Collectivity Condition", agents must be "glued" together around an ethos: they must be committed or bound to performing actions that advance the group's ethos. We-mode intending gives rise to collective rationality, such that, for instance, in the We-mode, you and I would both choose the second-best option in the standard prisoner's dilemma (the best option for us qua us), whereas in the I-mode we would each have to settle for third best.

Sondra Bacharach and Deborah Tollefsen illustrate the importance of, and perhaps argue for the irreducibility of, the concept of shared intention by reference to a certain theory of art interpretation: intentionalism. According to aesthetic intentionalism, we should interpret and appreciate art in terms of either the actual intentions of the artist(s) who created it or, according to another version of the theory, an hypothetical idealization of the intentions of the artist(s) who created it. If we are aesthetic intentionalists, then the interpretation of collaboratively produced art seems to require us to conceive shared intention as more than the sum of the individual, I-mode intentions of the individual artists, since in many cases collaboratively produced art aims at producing affects that are not the intention of any of the artists involved.

Clotilde Calabi examines what Searle calls "communal awareness", i.e., joint attention in cases without collective intention. Calabi, in developing her argument, examines variations of a case in which "Two parents are looking at their daughter playing, they exchange glances and smile." Joint attention seems like a pre-condition of collective intention and, perhaps, the most basic case of collective intentionality. Empirical psychology suggests that joint attention is rudimentary and fundamental in the development of human cognition. On the other hand, joint attention seems to require extremely complex philosophical explanation. What can we learn from this difference? Calabi argues that the philosophical account of joint attention must save the psychological appearances of immediacy and openness in joint attention. Moreover, she argues that the account must avoid an inferential regress in the perception of the requisite mutual recognition. Both of these requirements can be met by acknowledging that we can have non-inferential perception of mutual recognition.

What about shared emotions? Hans Bernhard Schmid argues that no account of shared emotions is adequate if it ignores the phenomenological features of emotions. He thus decries the recent trend towards cognitivism in the theory of shared emotions, according to which we can explain shared emotions solely in terms of their cognitive and practical features. He rejects "the days of affectivity-free intentionality and intentionality-free-affectivity." Advances in philosophical understanding of "the concept of sharedness" show that these are inadequate for understanding shared feeling. At least half of what we need in order to understand shared feeling is an understanding of feeling. Schmid covers amazingly broad ground -- across both analytic and continental philosophy -- in an effort to show that a phenomenology of feeling is necessary to the philosophy of collectivity, in its ontological, epistemological, and normative aspects.

In the first essay of Part II, David P. Schweikard provides a useful map of the conceptual territory in the theory of collective action. He does this with taxonomies of both theories of collective action and relevant action types. He classifies theories of collective action in terms of their reductionist commitments -- theories are committed to reductionism according to the ways and degrees by which they explain collective action in terms of individual action. For instance, a theory of collective action is more reductionist if it says that the subjects of collective actions are interrelated individuals, as Bratman's theory says, than if it says that the subjects of collective actions are collective agents, as Gilbert's and Pettit's theories say. He classifies relevant action types according to the ways and degrees with which they require commitment to collectivity. For instance, collectivity is less required for going for a walk together than tangoing, since one could go for a walk alone but one could not tango alone. Schweikard argues that some action types require less reductionism on the side of theory than others; so no single account of collective action is adequate. While his map is extremely useful, the breadth of his essay means that in most cases he merely names, rather than argues for, his reasons for accepting or rejecting various reductionisms.

Frank Hindriks's status account of corporate agents depends on conceiving collective agents from an external perspective. He thinks in terms of large collective agents, like universities, churches, and limited liability companies. These owe their status as collective agents to external recognition. For instance, universities once owed their status as degree-conferring institutions to the Pope. Today they owe that status to their governments. Crucial to their status is external recognition and corporate rationality -- the latter in a sense explicated by Philip Pettit, according to which they have in place decision procedures designed to ensure that their decisions do not fall victim to certain kinds of irrationality. Pettit's "discursive dilemma" is an example of such irrationality. The dilemma arises because a group decision procedure could allow embracing the premises and rejecting the conclusion of a valid argument. One could get such a result democratically, with no irrationality on the part of any voter, for instance. So the rationality of the collective institution requires some measure that prevents such irrationality, such as a rule that decides the conclusion based on democratically decided premises or a rule that limits democratic decision only to conclusions. On Hindriks's view, the combination of external recognition and corporate rationality is necessary to the explanation of corporate action.

It is difficult to avoid circularity in the theory of collective action, according to Bjorn Petersson. The problem is especially acute for accounts that rely on the notion of collective intentions. Indeed, it seems impossible to explain the difference between interrelated individual intentions and collective intentions in terms such that we can avoid re-using those terms, or using closely equivalent terms, in the explanans. Petersson argues that even authors of intentional accounts who are explicitly aware of the problem, like Bratman and Gilbert, fail to avoid it. Petersson proposes and defends an alternative to trying to take on this problem. He argues that we should look for the difference in non-intentional terms, i.e., in terms of what collectivity adds to intention, rather than in terms of a difference between collective and individual intentions.

Antti Saaristo begins by assuming an "uncompromising naturalistic materialism". Since, given such an assumption intentional states must reduce to brain states, it would seem as though collective intentionality would have to be utterly reduced to individual intentionality. Not so, according to Saaristo. Another alternative is that collective intentionality is constructed from individual intentionality such that, beyond a certain point, reduction to individual intentionality is no longer possible. In arguing for this alternative, Saaristo appeals to and develops Tuomela's account of the We-mode of intending, combined with a social solution to the problem of rule following.

Katinka Schulte-Ostermann contends that success in the theory of collective action requires that we either develop a better theory of individual agent causation or that we abandon the causalist approach to action. Schulte-Ostermann endorses the second option, maintaining that it has two important advantages. First, it alone is consistent with our clear notions of individual and collective action, on one hand, and our lack of any clear causal theory of the relation between body and mind, on the other. Second, we do not have the problems that we ought to have distinguishing between what someone did and what happened to her if the causal theory is true.

In the first essay of Part III, Facundo Martin Alonso argues for revision of Tuomela's and Bratman's accounts of the cognitive requirements for shared intentions. On Tuomela's view, if we have a shared intention to do X, then I must believe that you will do your part in what we intend and you must believe that I will do my part in what we intend. On Bratman's view, I must know or believe that you intend, or will come to intend, to do your part, and vice versa. Alonso thinks that Tuomela and Bratman are both right about the cognitive contents: "both the appeal to the other participant's relevant intentions, and the appeal to the other participant's actions are central to intending the joint activity." (215) However, Alonso argues that the requirement that these be the contents of beliefs is too strong. He argues that it can be sufficient for them to be the contents of reliances instead. He argues that I may rely on you to do your part, or vice versa, without believing, without even having good evidence for believing, that you will do your part, and I may rely on you without believing, without even having good evidence for believing, that you intend, or will come to intend, to do your part. Nevertheless, in such cases we can be engaged in a joint activity with a shared intention. Think, for instance (my example), of editors who frequently rely on authors to meet deadlines, without belief or good evidence -- probably in some cases with better counterevidence -- that the authors intend to or will in fact meet the deadlines.

Jennifer Hudin proposes and argues for a sophisticated alternative to Humean and Kantian theories of moral motivation on the basis of conceiving moral reasons as external "We-reasons". We have a moral sense, by which as members of a "motivational set" we in "We-mode" perceive behaviors as permissible, impermissible, or obligatory. The We-reasons disclosed in such perception are

practical reasons [that] function differently from other types of practical reasons because they do not require rational deliberation in order to motivate, therefore dispensing with any need for satisfaction of members in the motivational set, or any appeal to desire (passion) in any form. (237)

So moral motivation bears no internal connection with rationality, as in Kantian accounts, and it bears no internal connection with inclination, as in Humean accounts. Hudin's moral sense requires in tandem capacities for collective intentionality and social commitment -- a kind of emotional bond with the group. These give rise to We-mode normative perceptions of behavior and thus We-reasons of the sort that are central to this account.

Without rejecting intention based accounts of joint action, Monika Betzler argues that such accounts are wrong to neglect the significance of relationships in the account of joint action. She observes that, "Even when people are acting together, we sometimes believe that we are justified in criticizing them for not acting together in the right way". (255) On the basis of this argument she argues that sometimes "relationship-expressive" reasons are necessary for the explanation of joint action. In particular, she argues, "sharing interrelational values" explains some cases of joint action better than the alternative accounts, as when friends manage to successfully enjoy a vacation together or jazz musicians successfully manage to jam together. The necessity of the shared interrelational values to explaining the success of such joint actions becomes clear in their absence, as when one vacationing friend is too insensitive to whether the other is enjoying herself or one jazz musician is too insensitive to what the others are trying to do.

Nikos Psarros argues that a certain broad class of theories of collective action rest upon a mistake: they conceive the individual participants as

persons … driven by individual and also self-sufficiently existing preference resp. intentional structures, which somehow coincide with the intentions that are ascribed to an entity that is postulated as the -- real or theoretical -- subject of the collective action, e.g., a group or community. (273)

This assumed self-sufficiency, Psarros argues, is inconsistent with the cooperation that is essential for the concept of collective action. For instance, on the self-sufficiency model we cannot account for the coercive power by virtue of which participants in some kinds of collective action are compelled to do their parts, and we cannot account for why it is rational to risk freedom or life in some kinds of collective action. Psarros turns to Simone Weil's social account of "the Needs of the Human Soul" in order to develop an account of the participants in collective action as non-self-sufficient.

Francesca Raimondi considers the adequacy of Gilbert's "shared practice" account of political obligation to the liberal democratic ideal of pluralistic societies. On Gilbert's view, political obligations arise "from engagement in a collective practice". Raimondi finds appeal in the fact that Gilbert's view grounds political obligation in neither metaphysical facts nor individualistic values. However, Raimondi argues that Gilbert's view appeals to a false analogy between membership in small groups and membership in political collectives, and she argues that Gilbert's view suggests too much identity for the plurality of liberal democratic political collectives. Gilbert thinks that by engaging in a joint commitment with others I become part of a "plural subject", not in an ontological but in a normative sense. Through such engagement I move from individual consent to collective obligation. Although this account works reasonably well for small groups, which one joins relatively willingly, when we extrapolate to the much larger political case, the importance of initial individual consent falls away and the remaining collective obligation is implausibly insensitive to me as a group member, if the group is a pluralistic liberal democracy.

Generally, the philosophical methodology of these essays is rigorous and analytic, although none of the essays are too technical for the general philosophical reader. All are rendered in admirable English prose. Many are philosophically first-rate and none are inept or uninteresting. Philosophers of action and mind, and social philosophers, will benefit most from this anthology. However, many of the essays will also be of great interest to moral and political philosophers and philosophers of language, art, and science.