Confessions of a Confirmed Extensionalist and Other Essays; AND, Quine in Dialogue

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W. V. Quine, Confessions of a Confirmed Extensionalist and Other Essays, Dagfinn Føllesdal and Douglas B. Quine (eds.), Harvard University Press, 2008, 521pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674030848.

W. V. Quine, Quine in Dialogue, Dagfinn Føllesdal and Douglas B. Quine (eds.), Harvard University Press, 2008, 378pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674030831.

Reviewed by Gary Kemp, University of Glasgow


Here are eight hundred ninety-nine pages from the great man, covering interviews, articles and reviews, and sundry bits and bobs, including a facsimile of a poem. Decidedly, the first title -- Quine in Dialogue­ -- is much lighter, as measured both by weight and intellectual substance; readers interested only in Quine's philosophy would not miss a great deal in sticking only to Confessions. This latter work contains previously unpublished pieces ranging from 1946 to 1997, and previously published but in some cases hard to find articles from 1939 to his last article published in 2001, which contributes its name to the title of the book. Inevitably, this volume does not have the finish of the books published during his lifetime; it is -- largely due to repetition -- somewhat less than the sum of its parts. But not only do various points regarding the development of Quine's views for which he is elsewhere famous emerge quite strikingly, certain points, which only became clear to Quine after the publication of the second edition of Pursuit of Truth in 1992, emerge as essential to Quine's overall picture.

I'll attempt to convey some of the novel substance below, but first some of Quine in Dialogue. It is divided into three sections: Interviews, Quine on Other Philosophers, and Popular Pieces (which might well have been called 'Miscellaneous'; it includes pieces on atlases and dictionaries -- both well-known Quinean interests -- introductions to speakers including Kripke, Dummett, Church, Skinner and Piaget, addresses and memorials, remarks on politics, advice to graduate students, and other pieces including the aforementioned poem, and even remarks on God, which as always are condensed and measured). The first section is basically what you'd expect when the questions are largely chosen with a general audience in mind, not Quine specialists. Still Quine offers some worthwhile ways of putting his views, such as an acknowledgement of the fact, which one might think that his rigid empiricism would force him to deny, that some sentences are incapable of being tested but must be accepted as true and cognitively significant on the grounds that they serve to 'fill out' a theory (pp. 78-9; see also p. 199 and p. 225).

The middle section -- itself divided into four parts, entitled 'Correspondence', 'Articles', 'Reviews', and 'Responses' -- will provide more philosophical stimulation. 'Correspondence' is restricted to Quine's exchanges with Bertrand Russell. Eventually, one presumes, a great deal more of Quine's correspondence will become available (although there is already a volume of Quine's correspondence with Carnap: Dear Carnap, Dear Van: The Quine-Carnap Correspondence and Related Work, ed. by Richard Creath, Berkeley: University of California Press, 1990), but the exchange with Russell was published in 1988 and then again in 1989, so it must have made sense to include it here. The principle whereby an article was published here under 'Articles' rather than in Confessions was, I take it, that it was previously published but not mainly concerned with development or statement of Quine's own views. Highlights here are the discussion of Carnap and especially that of Davidson, about which more below. Highlights of the 'Reviews' section include his 1950 discussion of Nelson Goodman's The Structure of Appearance and his 1984 discussion of Charles Parsons' Mathematics in Philosophy. He is out of sympathy with much of the latter but, although he can't help letting a few impish remarks onto the page, gives a responsible and concise summary, if admittedly slanted towards points of contact with his own views.

The last part of the middle section -- 'Responses' -- contains many telling remarks. Truth is not transcendental but immanent, of course, but that just means that truth is no less real than light-rays, not that there is no such thing (p. 226). Quine takes back the declaration of 'Two Dogmas of Empiricism' that any sentence may be held true come what may -- a more moderate holism is sufficient and more plausible -- and comes to terms, in naturalistic terms, with analyticity (p. 233). These remarks are from the mid-1990's, and are significant because there remains a tendency to identify Quine with the radical holism and anti-analyticity of 'Two Dogmas' -- from 1953 -- when much of it came to be strategically disowned over the next forty-seven years in favour of a more nuanced view as his positive commitment to naturalism gradually took told.

His naturalism was evident in Word and Object (1960), but continued to grow as he coped with various challenges thrown up, and learned to discount others. Confessions consists of two sections of articles, one of twelve previously unpublished articles and the other of thirty-four previously published. It is peculiarly valuable for the illumination it provides for his shifting attitudes towards ontology -- especially that of abstract objects -- and the post-1992 sewing up of a persisting gap in his naturalized epistemology.

In 1946, in a piece written for the Harvard Philosophical Colloquium and which is included here, Quine wrote that he 'should like to be able to accept nominalism' (p. 9), and attempts to make a little progress up that imposing face. But over the next decade Quine came to accept abstract entities -- sets -- largely because no way was evident of doing without them. And then gradually he came to feel this reluctance was baseless. Partly this was implicit in his idea that, in the final analysis, all objects are posits. Even physical objects, from the point of view of a mature theory, should be regarded as in some sense optional, and the usual reason for seeking to avoid numbers and sets -- that they are evidently unperceivable -- evaporates with the rejection of perception as the locus of epistemology in favour of a more complicated scheme involving stimulus meaning, observation sentences and the rest of the 'apparatus of reference'. But a more radical move is well in evidence here: Ontology, he came to hold, though necessary because, roughly, we have to talk about something or other, any structurally similar ontology -- for example an ontology solely of sets -- is equally good as any other. This 'global structuralism' -- which is not a 'structuralist ontology', that is, it is not an ontology of structures; p. 406 -- is ultimately simply a corollary of naturalism: since ontological commitments are themselves commitments from within a theory of reality, they are real, but, as the existence of proxy-functions for example illustrates, genuine alternatives are always available. So any lingering distaste for abstract ontology must give way, perhaps surprisingly, to naturalism. The only viable argument for nominalism would have to show, not just that we can do without abstract objects, but that their postulation is contradictory or in some other way positively ruled out. See pp. 189, 281, 317, 339, 381, and 470.

The persisting epistemological gap was this. An observation sentence must be keyed to an individual's sensory receptors, and be such that any two witnesses to an event or situation would agree to a verdict. The agreement is necessary for communication, language-learning and translation. But why do in fact we find so much agreement? What accounts for intersubjectivity? It cannot be that two people receive the same or similar excitations of their sensory receptors, for that surely ought not to matter, and presumably does not actually happen, at least not normally. Davidson had long urged Quine to drop his insistence on his 'proximal' scheme which speaks of sensory receptors in favour of his 'distal' scheme, whereby the epistemologically basic phenomenon is a triangle whereby two people agree on the reference of a term to an object in the scene. Quine quite appropriately resisted, since it's difficult to see how reference could be admitted from the outset to epistemology without renouncing naturalism. But he had no alternative explanation to offer of the phenomenon as late as 1992.

The problem began with the 1960 Word and Object definition of observation sentence, and was becoming apparent by 1965. Although he was close to the solution long before 1992 -- as for example in 1975, 'The Nature of Natural Knowledge', p. 263 -- the exact problem was not quite clear to him until the mid-1990's. The problem as conceived in 1996 is to account for a 'preestablished harmony of standards of perceptual similarity, independent of intersubjective likeness of receptors or sensations' (pp. 474-5). He does so in terms of natural selection, 'Darwin's solvent of metaphysics':

We have … an inductive instinct: we tend to expect perceptually similar stimulations to have sequels that are similar to each other. This is the basis of expectation, habit formation, and learning. Successful expectation has always had survival value, notably as the elusion of predators and the capture of prey. Natural selection is accordingly favored innate standards of perceptual similarity which have tended to harmonize with trends in the environment. Hence the success, so much better than random, of our inductions and expectations. Derivatively, then, through our sharing of an ancestral gene pool, our innate standards of perceptual similarity harmonize also intersubjectively.

… Harmony without interaction: that was the subtlety. We take its ubiquitous effects for granted, not thinking them through. (p. 475; see also pp. 178, 184, 263, 371, 376, 464-5, 494; and also Quine in Dialogue pp. 254, 259, 346)

So it is gratifying that the last significant manoeuvre of the leading exponent of naturalism of the twentieth century involves a straightforward appeal to considerations made standard by the leading naturalist of the nineteenth, Charles Darwin; it's a neat stitch. Of course there is much more in the book, as shown by the titles of the articles. Of particular remarks, some of them are genuinely new, especially Quine's having raked over again the oft-tweaked definition of 'observation sentence' (pp. 476-7; cf. pp. 231, 273, 319, 411, 465, 477, 490). Less new but interesting all the same are his remarks about Naturalism (pp. 166, 176, 239, 260, 285, 320, 322, 363 and 467); about cognitively significant theoretical sentences that nevertheless play no role in the testing of theory, called 'outliers' (pp. 169, 190, 241, 270, 320, 395, 467-8); about the underdetermination of theory (pp. 366, 362-3, 384, 385, 433-7); and about the indeterminacy of translation (pp. 284, 346, 448). His 'Lectures on David Hume's Philosophy' (1946) are a tour de force that show both how relevant and how irrelevant Hume's philosophy was to him, and very nicely culminates in the observation that ultimately for Hume the question of science versus religion boiled down, bathetically and surely mistakenly, to one of faith versus faith. It is also instructive to realize that the sharp distinction between logic on the one hand and mathematics and set-theory on the other, which we take for granted, took a while to win acceptance. Quine of course was very much in the middle of it, especially in his Mathematical Logic of 1951 but also from much earlier; a reworked version of his Ph.D. thesis came out in 1934 as A System of Logic. Gödel had published his great theorems unknown to Quine in 1930 and 1931, but by the time A System of Logic appeared in 1934 Quine had met Carnap and read Gödel. It took a while for Quine to decide that the right place to draw the line dividing mathematics from pure logic is between those statements that are formally valid in virtue of the arrangements of truth-functions and quantifiers -- for which there is, as Gödel showed, a complete proof-procedure -- and those statements that are not formally valid in that sense, but which are true in virtue of the role of the sign for set-membership -- for which there is no proof-procedure, as Gödel showed; this is in 'Where Logic is Going' (1947).

I've concentrated on what is relatively new even for Quineans, but the clearest scholarly reason for the existence of Confessions of a Confirmed Extensionalist is simply that the book collects together important things that one may well have come across but only in journals or collections, including 'On the Reason for Indeterminacy of Translation', 'On Empirically Equivalent Systems of the World', 'Facts of the Matter', 'Progress on Two Fronts', and 'I, You, and It: An Epistemological Triangle'. The book takes its place alongside other collections that Quine published: From a Logical Point of View, Ontological Relativity and Other Essays, The Ways of Paradox, Selected Logic Papers and Theories and Things.

Dagfinn Føllesdal is a well-known philosopher and was once a student of W. V. Quine. Douglas B. Quine is not a philosopher but is of course Willard Van Orman's son; he provided much of the material that went into Quine in Dialogue, and keeps an ever-burgeoning mass of material of all philosophical and non-philosophical kinds appertaining to his father on his website,, which is well worth visiting. There are some glitches. On page 191 of Confessions we read 'then say of it. That it is a theorem of the system'; obviously that should be corrected to 'then we say of it that it is a theorem of the system'. On the same page we read 'finding the teat of them questionable anyway on other counts'; presumably we should treat 'teat' as 'treatment'. The word 'propositional' appears, no less than thirty-two times, as 'prepositional'; I would blame reliance on spell checkers but the word appears correctly at other times. The practice concerning what to do with sentences originally published but marked by W. V. Quine for deletion in his personal published copy appears to be inconsistent (p. 320 vs. p. 348). And on page 316 of Quine in Dialogue line 10 down read 'Refutation of an' for 'Refutation or an'.

The books are physically of excellent quality and refined appearance, and the use of footnotes rather than endnotes is welcome. Not everyone will like Steve Pyke's pictures on the jacket; the wide angle lens perhaps overemphasizes the near over the far, making philosophers into bug like creatures too much in keeping with popular preconceptions of other worldliness. But these are excellent additions to the Quinean corpus, not least because they are full of Quinean economical precision and wit; one likes to think that one is on the right side of Quine's rhetorical question about potential misreadings: 'Why write for a person who cannot read?' (Quine in Dialogue, p. 1).