Confronting Aristotle's Ethics: Ancient and Modern Morality

Placeholder book cover

Eugene Garver, Confronting Aristotle's Ethics: Ancient and Modern Morality, University of Chicago Press, 2006, 290pp., $49.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226283982.

Reviewed by Gabriel Richardson Lear, University of Chicago


There is an identity between being good and doing good.  That is to say, the activities which express the perfection of the human soul are the very same activities which are successful at bringing about good ends.  This at least is Aristotle's claim.  In Confronting Aristotle's Ethics, Eugene Garver promises to face up to the views that support Aristotle's ethical position, views which Garver finds simultaneously appealing and repellent, and altogether more alien than is often supposed by contemporary scholars who tend to domesticate Aristotle's thought (pp. 2-3).

The ethical theory that emerges from his interpretation is, indeed, alien to modern sensibilities.  As Garver reads the Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle is concerned to show that virtuous, political action, especially when perfected by thêoria, is more perfectly active (more an energeia) than any other thing we can do.  "To be is to be active.  We realize our nature by being as active as possible.  Effective human action embodies the metaphysical urge to convert incomplete processes into complete activities, a metaphysical imperative Aristotle calls the love for the noble," (p. 7).  Unlike either craft making or vicious action, virtuous action is both the realization of our soul's capacities and a doing the end of which is an end in itself.

The emphasis in Garver's interpretation on the metaphysical categories of energeia, kinêsis, and dynamis is not a reflection of what one finds on the surface of the Nicomachean Ethics.  Aristotle does insist that happiness is an energeia rather than a disposition (hexis, NE I.8 1098b31-1099a7) and that virtue is a disposition rather than a dynamis (NE II.5), but he never discusses these distinctions in any detail.  And although he does believe that happiness is an energeia rather than a kinêsis, his discussion of these two sorts of doing occurs in an analysis of pleasure, not of virtue (NE X.4 1174a13-1174b14).  Rather than focus on how virtuous action is perfectly active, Aristotle is much more concerned to establish that happiness is an unqualified telos or end.  This is the fulcrum of his arguments in NE I and X that the actualization of the best virtue is happiness.  Still, although Garver's emphasis is unusual, it is not outlandish.  (Neither a kinêsis nor a dynamis is the kind of thing that could be an ultimate end.)  Furthermore, the guiding question of his study -- how Aristotle can be so confident that the activity which perfects the soul will also be successful, effective action -- is an important one to ask and invites his sort of approach.  Indeed, this book is full of good questions.  Unfortunately, the solutions Garver proposes are not as successful as one might hope.  His arguments often rely on very strained, if not just mistaken, readings of the text and are either disorganized or replete with non-sequiturs.  This is a shame since he makes several provocative proposals worth considering.  It is a shame also because his approach to the Ethics is refreshing, both in its determination not to assimilate it to our own modern intuitions and in its passionate, personal engagement.  (An affecting moment comes when he explains Aristotle's distinction between what's good and what's good for us by recounting his own realization in graduate school that although Richard McKeon was a great teacher, he was not the right teacher for him (p. 43).)  The book consists of seven chapters.  I describe their contents and raise some concerns below.

For Aristotle, virtuous action is the best both because it secures the most desirable goods and because it most perfectly realizes and fulfills the soul.  The first sort of success suggests an analogy between virtue and craft, since crafts also are psychic capacities to act in ways that reliably achieve desirable ends.  In the first two chapters, Garver explores first the analogies and then the disanalogies between virtue and craft, giving particular attention to the craft of rhetoric.

We might be tempted to assume that Aristotle distinguishes virtuous action from craft making by the fact that the former does and the latter does not have an "internal" end.  (Consider, for example, what he says at NE VI. 5 1140b6-7: "While the end of [craft] making is other than itself, the end of action could not be, for good action is itself the end.")  Garver, however, argues that both craft and virtue have both internal and external ends.  That is to say, both aim to bring about results independent of the action and aim to do so in a certain way, either in a technically correct way or in a virtuous way.  Furthermore, he argues that these internal ends arise when practitioners limit the means which they consider to be appropriate to the end.  For example, the orator who practices his art correctly will not whip the jury into a vindictive fury even if this might be an effective means of getting them to vote for the prosecution, but will instead limit himself to rational persuasion.  Garver calls this process of limiting means 'internalizing ends': "We start with a given [external] end and deliberate about how to achieve it.  […]  Through that process, we discover that some aspects of that end can be achieved in good action and not merely by action.  Those aspects are objects of decision and knowledge," (p. 38, cf. p. 28).

Virtue differs from craft, Garver thinks, not by having internal ends, but by giving those internal ends priority.  By contrast, the internal ends of craft are always subordinated to the external end.  Whereas an orator or a doctor may on occasion pursue his external end in a way that is technically incorrect but potentially more effective, a virtuous person will never willingly "make a mistake".  In addition, commitment to the internal end does not prevent the craftsman from pursuing nonstandard or indeed opposed external ends.  The internal ends of virtuous action, on the other hand, limit which external ends the agent can pursue.  Unlike craft making, virtuous action is chosen and is worth choosing for its own sake.  Because it has a "true" end in itself, virtuous action is more complete and thus more active (more an energeia) than craft making.

I am in sympathy with Garver's intuition that we should think more carefully about Aristotle's craft analogy.  But it is worth pointing out that in these chapters Garver makes some puzzling claims.  He says that, for Aristotle, there are effective courses of medical treatment which nevertheless "violate the rules of the art of medicine" (p. 46).  A doctor who prescribed them would bypass the internal end of medicine.  However, it is unlikely that Aristotle would consider such a treatment a violation of medicine.  The job of the craftsman is to discover means to his end on the basis of his general understanding of his area of expertise.  This understanding is not a set of rules or craft laws (as Garver suggests with his parallel to equity); it is an understanding of the causes of the craft product.  It is this systematic knowledge which distinguishes artistic from inartistic production (Metaphysics I.1).  Thus, so long as the doctor uses his medical knowledge to settle on an unusual cure, his prescription will be in accordance with his craft.  Garver is driven to his surprising view of medicine by his claim that every craft has an internal end in the sense of selecting certain means to its external end, rejecting all others as outside the proper practice of the craft.  Thus, in doubting Garver's medical example, I am doubting his (quite interesting) claim that Aristotelian crafts have internal ends.  His evidence, even with regard to rhetoric, is, I think, inadequate.  For instance, he cites Rhetoric I.2 1355b35-39, a passage which claims that some means of persuasion, such as witnesses and the testimony of slaves, are inartistic.  However, Aristotle does not mean that a proper practitioner of rhetoric will not use these means.  On the contrary, he explicitly says that the orator will use them -- and presumably his use will be artful.  They are inartistic means only in the sense that the orator does not use his general craft knowledge to provide these means.  Admittedly, however, this issue is complicated, especially with regard to rhetoric.

More important, Garver finds disanalogies between craft and virtue in places where Aristotle explicitly draws analogies.  For example, Garver says that "only the virtues allow a difference between performing a virtuous act and acting as the virtuous man would act" (p. 52).  This is an astonishing thing to say, given that Aristotle explains this distinction by appeal to the analogous distinction in craft.  Just as a person acts artistically only if his production is guided by craft knowledge, so too a person acts virtuously only if his actions are the manifestation of his character (NE II.4 1105a21-33).[1]  But let us return to the description of Garver's book.

Virtue differs from craft also in that its realization perfects and actualizes the soul.  Thus it is more active than craft along this dimension as well.  Garver argues that the link between virtue as a capacity for successful action and virtue as a perfection of the soul is more tenuous than perhaps Aristotle realized.  In Chapter Three he discusses four reasons virtuous practice may fail to live up to Aristotle's promise: (1) What if there are parts of the human good that can't be achieved by any practice (he mentions leadership and parenting as possibilities)?  (2) What if some practices routinely fail to achieve their external end?  (3) What if the practices which most reliably achieve good external ends also stunt the condition of the souls of their practitioners (as Aristotle thought many of the crafts do)?  (4) What if the practices which perfect the soul put one at odds with one's community?  These "moral failures," as Garver calls them, are not the ones we routinely see in discussions of Aristotelian virtue and I found it very useful to consider them.  (For example, Garver points out that (3) risks pernicious social consequences, dividing the citizenry into those who practice base technique and those with the leisure for noble dilettantism (pp. 81-89).)

Chapter Four examines Aristotle's claim that virtue is a mean or intermediate condition of the soul.  Garver asks us to compare moral virtue to the autofocus mechanism on a camera (p. 101).  Virtue is that disposition to calibrate one's passions in the process of deliberating what to do, with the result that one performs a noble action, viz. an "act which fully develops the passion into an action done for its own sake" (pp. 111-112).  Vice, by contrast, "realize[s] either too much or too little of the passions.  The wrong amounts of a passion are wrong because they are amounts that cannot be fully realized in an action," (p. 108).  This is a bizarre account of what's wrong with vice and I wish Garver had explained more fully what it means to say that vicious actions do not fully realize vicious passions.  I wish also that he had provided evidence that this is Aristotle's view.  (He quotes NE II.6 1106b29 to the effect that "error is multiform" (p. 108), but it is unclear to me how this supports his interpretation.)

Chapter Five discusses the political nature of Aristotelian virtue.  He reasonably suggests that, for Aristotle, we become virtuous by learning to do for their own sakes the actions which the law requires.  Aristotle thinks this because he conceives of the virtuous relationship between reason and the passions within the soul as a sort of political rule.  "For reason to rule politically, we must listen to our own reason, and we learn to do that by listening to and obeying the reason of others, and most of all the reason of the laws," (p. 130).  More controversially, Garver claims that only actual rulers engaged in the business of ruling possess phronêsis; when they are being ruled in turn, they do not exercise practical wisdom or even possess it as a capacity (although he does say that virtuous citizens must be capable of phronêsis, pp. 145-148).  Instead, they have merely right opinion about how to obtain their ends.  It is the job of rulers to determine through wisdom all the means which citizens will take (p. 146).  However, this extraordinarily interventionist and unappealing view of the state's role in the life of the citizenry seems to be based on a mistaken reading of Politics III.4.  Garver understands Aristotle's point in that chapter to be that phronêsis is restricted to rulers (p. 144).  In fact, Aristotle says that phronêsis is unnecessary for good citizenship, provided one is not a ruler (ouk anangkaion, 1277a15-16).  He never denies that a decent private citizen could be practically wise.[2]

Chapter Six addresses the difficulty of squaring Aristotle's conception of virtue with the classifications of dynameis offered in Metaphysics IX.  Garver believes that ethical inquiry requires "a deeper analysis of rational powers than the Metaphysics provides" (p. 172), since virtue synthesizes what look in the Metaphysics to be opposed and exclusive categories: virtue is an active power that depends on passivity, a rational power that perfects the irrational soul, an acquired power that is more natural than any with which we are born (pp. 183-187).  Accordingly, his reading of Metaphysics IX emphasizes the questions it does not ask or answer and the (alleged) incoherences this presents; to solve them we must turn to the Ethics and Politics.  (Garver claims that Aristotle "organizes" these practical works around questions he "fails to raise in the Metaphysics" (p. 176) and that "[a]s the Ethics advances, the meanings of 'active' and 'passive' become more sophisticated" (p. 184).)  I have qualms about this method of reading a text; if we are always on the lookout for ways it fails to address our concerns, we risk missing what a text can teach us.  And indeed, I found Garver's treatment of Metaphysics IX to be rather cursory.  However, the point that this chapter illustrates -- that metaphysics is incomplete without practical wisdom -- plays a central and interesting role in his final chapter.

In Book X.7-8 of the Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle argues that the life of theôria is happiest while the political life of moral virtue is happy in a secondary way.  This is a surprising conclusion for a treatise devoted almost entirely to moral virtue and over the past sixty years scholars have proposed numerous suggestions for interpreting it.  In Chapter Seven, Garver makes his own proposal: the philosophical life of theôria is not in conflict with the political life; rather, the philosophical life perfects the political life by giving it unity.  Theôria achieves this unification of virtuous political actions because these actions are the subject of theôria.  In fact, Garver argues, it is misleading to say that theôria is a separate activity from virtuous action.  We can, of course, engage in contemplation at a time when we are not acting generously or bravely, for example.  That is to say, we can treat theôria and virtuous activity as two acts.  But Garver thinks that this theôria is itself a reflection upon and becoming self-aware about the theôria which is already implicit in virtuous practice (p. 199).  The philosophical life grows out of the life of phronêsis because it is an amplification and perfection of the knowledge in that virtuous, political life.  When we focus on the theoretical unity possessed by the multitude of virtuous political actions, the two lives become hard to distinguish: "Seen as many energeiai, the best life is political; seen as a single energeia, the best life is contemplative," (p. 193).  This is what Garver calls the two end interpretation of the two lives.

The idea that theôria in Book X takes morally virtuous action as its subject matter, rather than theology or science, is interesting and provocative.  In its favor is the fact that in the Nicomachean Ethics the word theôria (or the cognate verb, theôrein) usually refers to reflection on moral practice (e.g., 1100b19-20, 1122b16-17, 1170a2-4).  Still, Garver treats theôria in Book X as the activity of sophia, the virtue of the theoretical (versus practical) part of the rational soul, and this creates a problem for his interpretation.  For in NE VI, where Aristotle discusses sophia, he quite clearly distinguishes it from phronêsis in terms of its subject matter.  Theoretical reason knows "the sort of being whose principles cannot be otherwise" (VI.2 1139a6-8) and "things much more divine in their nature than man" (VI.7 1141a34-b1), whose actions phronêsis knows.  Thus, if the theôria of Book X is the activity of sophia as it is described in Book VI, then it cannot be another, more self-aware, "mode" of the reflection expressed in practical wisdom (p. 203).

The evidence Garver presents for his interpretation is also fairly thin.  Take, for instance, his claim that the philosophical life is best because its contemplative activity unifies virtuous political actions (p. 193).  Aristotle never compares the unity or wholeness of the two lives.  His argument, rather, is that philosophical activity is more continuous, pleasant, self-sufficient, leisurely, and ultimate as an end than political action.  Garver almost entirely ignores these explicit arguments.  (He mentions them in one sentence, p. 201.)  Or consider, to take another example, his claim that "the first half of NE X.7 shows that the life of theôria is a realization of phronêsis, not of studying theology," (p. 201).  His evidence seems to be that unless we adopt this interpretation, we will be forced to view contemplation as the activity of "something alien that happens to live inside us" (p. 204).  Since Aristotle clearly says that theôria is properly human, Garver concludes that it cannot consist in theology.  But this is simply to ignore another possibility, which after all has a long intellectual history, namely, that thinking about the divine and engaging in a limited way in the sort of thinking the gods enjoy is a properly human activity.  Moreover, this interpretation fits what seems to be Aristotle's point in NE X.7 1178a2-7: that as divine and superhuman as contemplation at first appears, it is genuinely human.

Finally, consider Garver's claim that Aristotle himself distinguishes two ways of comparing the philosophical and the political lives, as either two acts or as two ends (p. 195).  His evidence is the following passage:

It is disputed whether decision or act is the more controlling factor in virtue, as it is alleged to depend on both; now the perfection of virtue will clearly consist in both; but the performance of virtuous actions requires much outward equipment, and the more so the greater and more noble the actions are.  (Garver's translation, NE X.8 1178a35-b3)

Garver interprets the point of this passage to be that if we treat theôria and virtuous action as two acts, then the latter needs more equipment (and so is less self-sufficient) than the former.  But if, on the other hand, we treat them as two purposes or decisions (i.e., as two ends), then there is not much to tell between them.  How does Garver find this latter point in the passage above?  He writes,

Mentioning the dispute about 'whether decision or act is the more controlling factor in virtue' is a digression unless it is designed to show that, considered as purposes as opposed to praxeis, the contrast between philosophical and political lives dissolves … (p. 206)

However, Garver's reading is hardly the only one which avoids finding a digression in the text.  According to a widespread interpretation, Aristotle wants to ward off a possible objection to his claim that virtuous action requires more equipment than does theôria, namely that forming a correct decision requires hardly any equipment at all.  His point is that even if decision is the authoritative aspect of virtue it would be imperfect without successful completion of the action.  Thus, fully perfected instances of virtuous action require far more equipment than does contemplation.  Notice that according to this standard reading, Aristotle never suggests that we might compare theôria and virtuous action in terms of the prohaireseis involved.  Furthermore, Garver's alternative suggestion is strained.  Since the activity of sophia (a theoretical rather than a practical virtue) cannot involve prohairesis, and since therefore we cannot sensibly inquire whether the prohairesis involved in moral virtue requires more or less equipment than does the prohairesis involved in contemplation, Garver must read Aristotle as covertly indicating an entirely different topic (viz., how much equipment we need for the decisions, but not the actions, involved in lives focused on these activities).  It would be good to have better evidence than this that Aristotle himself is aware of and alternates between the two act and the two end interpretations.

In conclusion, I want to draw attention to a problem that is not Garver's fault.  The University of Chicago Press has done a shoddy job of proof reading this book.  I counted nineteen obvious typos in 224 pages of main text; that's roughly one every twelve pages.  Most of these were easy to read around, but one was quite confusing.[3]  A book published by a major university press ought to be produced better than this.

[1] According to this passage, virtue differs from craft in that (1) the guiding role of knowledge is relatively unimportant in determining whether an act is fully virtuous and (2) the quality of the product does not determine whether an act was done well.

[2] Garver cites Politics III.5 1278b4-5 as further evidence for his interpretation, but the full sentence shows that this phrase does not support his view: “Whether the excellence by which one is a good man is the same or different from that by which one is a decent (spoudaios) citizen, it is clear from what has been said that in some cities the good man and the decent citizen are the same and in others they are different.  And where they are the same, it is not every [citizen who is a good man] but the statesman and the person who is or is capable of being in authority over the management of the common business, either by himself or with others,” (Pol. 1278a40-b5).  In other words, even in cities where being a good citizen does coincide with being a fully virtuous person, this requirement holds only for the ruling class.

[3] “Young men with innate hos and love of the noble (philokalon) can be influenced by virtue … , and I want to end this chapter by exploring that innate hos and love of the noble,” (p. 116).  Hos is the masculine relative pronoun.  Eventually I realized that hos should have been êthos, character.  Other typos: pp. 36. 45, 51, 53, 62, 65, 72 (3 on this page), 78, 130, 133, 147, 168, 172, 181, 222.