Confronting Injustice: Moral History and Political Theory

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David Lyons, Confronting Injustice: Moral History and Political Theory, Oxford University Press, 2013, 240pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199662555.

Reviewed by Laurence Thomas, Syracuse University


In his Politics, Aristotle claimed that it is natural that there should be slaves. Of course, it probably did not cross Aristotle's mind at all that the slaves should be black. Indeed, a white slave is what Aristotle typically had in mind. A millennium later, however, the idea that slaves should be black had very much gained a secure hold in the thinking of many people throughout the world who belonged to the white ethnic group. And the slavery of blacks in the United States unequivocally stands as the most sustained and pugnacious instantiation of black slavery ever to have occurred in the history of humankind. David Lyons's marvelous book is a most informed and majestically searching discussion of American Slavery.

Now, as Lyons makes clear in chapter 2 by way of examples, the institutionalized enslavement of blacks was not the initial intention of whiteswho first settled in North America. For there were blacks who, like whites, came to the United States as indentured servants. About the state of Virginia, Lyons writes:

In sum, the system of chattel slavery that developed in Virginia was not inevitable. It was neither inherited by the colonists nor brought over from Britain. For several decades, social mobility was possible in Virginia society even for African slaves. African Americans were able to acquire economic independence and respected social status (p. 58)

Bit-by-bit, though, laws were enacted that clearly made it increasingly more difficult for blacks to be free, with the result being that a free black would essentially become non-existent. That reality is particularly poignant because what the above quote implies is simply that there was no difference between blacks and whites. In particular, there was no difference in terms of either intellect or moral character.

So, there can be little doubt that the considerable traction of slavery in the United States and the viciousness of Jim Crow practices, about which Lyons speaks, had much to do with the physical appearances whereby a black and a white were readily distinguishable from one another. However, there is another factor that Lyons does not consider and that many black Americans do not wish to consider, namely that black Africans played a non-trivial role in blacks coming to the United States with the status as morally inferior beings. This is because there were blacks in power in various African countries who sold blacks to whites. In the matter of evil, there can be a multitude of non-excusable factors. Clearly, the viciousness of Jim Crow practices and their dehumanization of blacks was a non-excusable factor. But so was blacks selling blacks to whites.

An article in the newspaper Slate Afrique entitled "Les Africains ont une responsibilité dans la traite des Noirs" (16 March 2012) attributes to Alain Mabanckou the following general view that would not surprise anyone and on which there is near universal agreement nowadays: "The treatment of Blacks is one of the shames of humanity. A crime against humanity. So it is whether we are talking about Europeans via the Atlantic or Arabs via the Sarah or Zanzibar." But then we have this direct quote from Mabanckou:

It would be a mistake to maintain that all by themselves Whites captured Blacks in order to reduce Blacks to slaves. The responsibility on the part of Blacks with respect to the exploitive treatment of blacks continues to be a taboo among Africans who refuse to look at themselves in the mirror.

Needless to say, Mabanckou's remarks do not in any way weaken Lyons's line of argument regarding the wrong of slavery in the United States. Rather, his remarks poignantly point out that blacks were horrendously mistreated by blacks, and that blacks played a very significant role in whites being able to treat blacks from Africa so venomously. Significantly, there is no biological law or disposition regarding ethnicity according to which members of the same ethnic group are, on that account alone, invariably in harmony with one another.

Of course, the immoral selling of blacks by blacks hardly justified the immoral enslavement of blacks by whites or any other group. For as the saying goes, two wrongs do not make a right. Just so, the selling of blacks by blacks most certainly provided whites with a very good rationalization for viewing blacks as inferior. Without Africans routinely selling blacks in Africa to whites from America, it is not at all obvious that slavery in the United States would have ever developed into the ever so morally pugnacious institution it come to be. And some Africans have indeed apologized for the selling of blacks into slavery by Africans.[1]

Before turning to other topics, it is also worth noting that (i) other peoples have enslaved blacks and that (ii) whites have been enslaved. With regard to (i), there is the now classic essay entitled "Mémoire sur le Commerce des Negres au Kaire, et les maladies auxquelles ils sont sujet en yarrivant" (1802), which speaks of blacks being enslaved by Arabs. Regarding (ii), there is Michael A. Hoffman's They Were White and They Were Slaves, which speaks of the enslavement of whites throughout history.

Moving on, Lyons's discussion of the violence of Jim Crow laws and practices (chapter 5) after black slavery in America officially ended in 1865 is extremely rich and informative. Indeed, a careful reading of chapter 5 occasions the quite poignant thought that there is a non-trivial respect in which things got worse for blacks after slavery. Here is the reasoning that occasions such a thought: during slavery, the ownership of black slaves was to be respected by all whites, whether they were slave owners or not and whether the whites were poor or not. Killing someone else's slave constituted committing a serious wrong against the person who owned the slave (unless there was some woefully harmful behavior being committed by the slave that put the well-being of other whites in jeopardy or otherwise constituted an egregious harm to a white). Lyons writes:

No longer valuable private property, blacks could be killed with impunity [by any white]. White supremacy was thus violently re-established and, during the most intense period of lynching, Jim Crow was sanctified by the Supreme Court's 1896 decision in Plessy vsFerguson (163 U.S. 537, 552). (98)

I added the words "by any white" for that is one of the differences that mightily marked the difference between slavery and the Jim Crow era. What is more, the non-trivial fact that Lyons does not make explicit is that, with the ending of slavery, it was the social standing of poor whites in general that was far more negatively affected than was the social standing of well-off whites, since poorer whites could no longer affirm their social superiority to blacks merely by pointing to the reality that, unlike themselves (the poor whites), blacks are slaves. What is more, while it would simply have been in the utter disinterest of any white slave owner to kill randomly, especially on a routine basis, any black person whom the white owned, the ending of slavery resulted in the reality that it was not at all contrary to the interest of whites, including poor ones, to kill any black person whom they felt like killing. Thus, we might very well think of Jim Crow laws as the racist manifesto of poor whites. To be sure, there were non-poor whites who engaged in Jim Crow practices. But that truth is compatible with the view that Jim Crow practices where the vehicle whereby poor whites regained a non-trivial measure of the social affirmation that they lost with the ending of black slavery.

In commenting upon how things proceeded with the official ending of slavery, Lyons is very informative in pointing out the sustained role that the United States government played in maintaining racism and allowing the racist ideology of 'separate but equal' to obtain a secure hold upon the thinking of whites. For it turns out that, time and time again, either the United States Supreme Court did not strike down very clear racist practices or the members of the United States Senate and the House of Representatives did not pass laws prohibiting such practices.

The considerations of the preceding two paragraphs raise a quite interesting question, to wit: what was worse for blacks? Was it (i) being a black slave and thus being at the mercy of essentially one white family, which nonetheless afforded one a non-trivial measure of protection from all other whites? Or, was it (ii) not being a slave and being at the mercy of any white person who might take offense at anything one did or failed to do, including the mere fact that one was just seconds slower than expected in saying "yes ma'am" or "yes sir"? If there is any truth to the saying "Better the devil you know than the one you don't," then it is quite possible that there were periods after slavery officially ended when (ii) turned out to be worse than (i). Lyons does not make this claim. However, he says enough about the horrific things that took place after slavery had officially ended that mightily raises the question of whether there might have been occasions when (ii) would indeed have been true. The idea that there might have been times when Jim Crow could have been worse than slavery should not surprise anyone; for there have been utterly evil practices throughout the history of human kind that did not involve slavery, as the case of Nazi Germany makes unmistakably clear.

Now, it should come as no surprise at all that Lyons does not hold the view that laws, simply in virtue of being such, should command our respect. This sets him apart from such distinguished theorists as John Rawls and Ronald Dworkin. Indeed, Lyons makes the following very strong claim against the view that there is rightly a presumption that laws should be obeyed: "[The] endorsement of political obligation, while possessing sufficient knowledge of settings like Jim Crow, can reasonably be characterized as a derivative but socially important form of racism" (p. 146). While I fully agree with the spirit of Lyons's remark, it is perhaps useful to distinguish between endorsing a law and acknowledging that there are circumstances when mere compliance with regard to such laws is preferable to non-compliance. Indeed, Lyons would seem to imply as muchhimself when he writes several pages earlier that "we should not be misled by the limited aims of King's resistance activities" (p. 144). Presumably, King was compliant at times with the very aim of being defiant at other times, where the defiance would yield the greatest results in terms of bringing about a more racially just American society. There can be no objecting to that approach. What is true, of course, is that it cannot turn out that every excuse is a good excuse for being compliant. These considerations tell us something rather obvious, namely that a person will not be effective in combating evil if she or he is readily given to self-deception.

Speaking of self-deception, I am increasingly convinced that it is one of the handmaidens of evil. Few things intrigue me more than the capacity that human beings have for self-deception. Hitler had no reason whatsoever to believe that Jews were unbelievably evil people who needed to be taken off the face of the earth if humanity was to thrive in the ways that it should. And how is it even remotely possible to have someone whom one deems to be both morally and intellectually inferior care for one's children as countless white slave owners did? There has never been any reason to suppose that blacks as such are inferior to all whites (or whomever). And in South Africa there has in recent years been the practice of "corrective rape," where black men rape black lesbians in order to bring it about that the women become heterosexuals. And presently in the United States, we have the "knock out" punch where black males brutally attack and typically kill a random white person. Yet, there is never a word of outrage on the part of blacks. Following the work of the evolutionary biologists William von Hippel and Robert Trivers in "The Evolution and Psychological of Self-Deception,"[2] it would seem that the capacity for self-deception among human beings was occasioned by the significant advantages that usually come with human beings fitting-in. And whites were quite adept in coming up with explanations or reasons for the enslavement of blacks.[3] As it happens, the Civil Rights Movement led by King and the movement for equality in India led by Gandhi aretwo truly majestic cases in human history where fitting-in is tied to a commitment to bring about justice. But this was against the backdrop of the immutable truth that folks had little if anything to lose and so very much to gain.

I should like to conclude this review with a rather searching question. He rightly points to the deplorable conditions of blacks that, at this point in time, still exist throughout the United States. And he blames those conditions on racism in various forms. Lyons is ever so majestic in his account that the United States owes much to blacks for the wrongs inflicted upon blacks for centuries up to the present. My worry, though, is whether blacks may have unwittingly internalized a less than favorable conception than is justified of what blacks can and should do. I have this worry because even with the concession that Lyons is right and much remains to be done in order to combat the serious forms of racism that still exist, there is the profound truth that many blacks are now in the position to make a remarkable and ever so positive difference in the lives of black people, as I shall illustrate with one telling example.

In recent years, numerous "mom and pop" stores owned by non-black immigrants have opened up across the United States in numerous black neighborhoods. Although in many cases these storeowners can barely speak English, there is the poignant fact that owing to the large number of black customers who frequent the stores these owners are running a quite profitable business even though the owners typically have little formal education. Well, at this point in the history of America what good explanation can there possibly be for why blacks do not own such stores in their very own neighborhoods? Indeed, if one black is not financially in the position to set up a "mom and pop" store, then two or three blacks could do so jointly. Banks are quite willing to lend the money for such an endeavor. In fact, rap artists could sponsor such endeavors; and so there could be the Rap Artist Mom and Pop Store in this or that neighborhood. In terms of the good that these "mom and pop" stores would accomplish, the black storeowners would, among other things, be setting a marvelous example for black youth in the community, all the while commanding the respect of whites throughout the United States. So a very simple question that mightily presents itself, to wit, is: why is it that black owned "mom and pop" stores are not at all common in black neighborhoods?

I do not have an answer to the question that I have raised. But I wonder whether or not Lyons would hold the view that centuries of racism against blacks in the United States have taken their toll upon the psychological well-being of black people. And the fact that I should find myself asking that question for the very first time speaks to the tremendous intellectual power and insightfulness, as well as marvelous honesty of thought, on the part of Lyons in Confronting Injustice.

[2] Behavioral and Brain Sciences (2011) v. 34. 

[3] See Condorcet, Réflexions sur l'esclavage des nègres (1781), (Paris: GF Flammerion 2009), ch. 2, Raisons dont on se sert pour excuser del'esclavage des nègres (Reasons that were given as an excuse for the enslavement of negroes.)