Confucius, Rawls, and the Sense of Justice

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Erin M. Cline, Confucius, Rawls, and the Sense of Justice, Fordham University Press, 2013, 354pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823245086.

Reviewed by Bryan W. Van Norden, Vassar College


I was not optimistic when I first read the title of this book. The fact that Rawls and Confucius are immensely influential and intellectually captivating thinkers in their respective traditions makes a comparison of their views seem superficially appealing. However, the differences between Rawls and Confucius are massive. Rawls is a theoretician of pluralistic liberal democracy, who writes in a systematic style; Confucius is an ethical teacher advocating a comprehensive Way of life, whose sayings are evocative and therapeutic. Any comparison between them would either, I thought, be thin and unilluminating, or wildly inaccurate. Consequently, it was a very pleasant surprise to discover that Erin Cline's comparative study is nuanced, philosophically informed, Sinologically sound, and illuminating.

Cline borrows Rawls's distinction between the concept of justice, a conception of justice, and the sense of justice. The concept of justice is what we might call the thin or minimal understanding of justice that is shared by anything we could count as an account of justice. According to the concept of justice, "institutions are just when no arbitrary distinctions are made between persons in the assigning of basic rights and duties and when the rules determine a proper balance between competing claims to the advantages of social life" (76).[1] A conception of justice, in contrast, is a detailed formulation of what counts as "arbitrary distinctions" and a "proper balance." Finally, a sense of justice is "the capacity to understand, to apply, and to act from principles of justice" (85). Cline acknowledges that Rawls and Confucius have radically different conceptions of justice. However, she argues that they share the concept of justice and the belief that all humans have a capacity for a sense of justice. In fleshing out these claims, Cline makes a number of interesting (and I think very plausible) claims. (1) Rawls's often-overlooked account of the development and cultivation of a sense of justice is remarkably similar to a Confucian account of ethical cultivation. (2) Reflection on these similarities suggests ways in which Confucian discussions of ethical cultivation can be used to clarify and strengthen Rawls's view. (3) An exploration of the concept of justice in the collected sayings of Confucius allows us to see novel aspects of familiar passages. (4) The view of ethical cultivation that Rawls and Confucius seem to share has substantive implications for matters of public policy.

In her Introduction, Cline gives an overview of previous work on justice in the Analects (the sayings of Confucius), most of which has argued for the absence of a concept of justice that could be fruitfully compared with any Western account. One common argument is that Confucius cannot have the concept of justice because there is no single term in Chinese that is accurately translated as "justice." This line of argument is sometimes invidiously labeled the "lexical fallacy," and Cline presents compelling evidence that it is in fact fallacious (10-15, 150-157).

Chapter 1 is an overview of methodological issues raised by comparative philosophy. Cline offers a typology of the challenges that comparativists face:

thematic issues (concerning what one compares, including one's choice of topic and texts or thinkers to compare), interpretive issues (concerning one's interpretations of the texts or thinkers under study), and procedural issues (concerning how one conducts one's study, including particular methods or approaches)" (48, emphasis in original).

She explores these challenges through a brief but accurate survey of some of the major contemporary approaches, including Lee Yearley's search for "similarities in differences and differences in similarities,"[2] Martha Nussbaum's appeal to "thick" vs. "thin" concepts,[3] Karen Carr and Philip Ivanhoe's discussion of the criteria for choosing thinkers and texts to compare,[4] and Aaron Stalnaker's use of "bridge concepts."[5] Cline concludes by claiming that she herself uses an "anti-method" approach, which tries "to give attention to interpretive, thematic, and procedural issues" (72), but without subscribing to any particular methodology for doing so. However, it seems to me that Cline does have a methodology: she uses the "thin" concepts of "justice," "sense of justice," and "ethical cultivation" to identify general topics discussed by both Confucius and Rawls, and then explores the similarities and differences in their detailed, "thick" conceptions of these terms. In addition, she is, qua philosopher, particularly interested in examining whether Rawls and Confucius provide "accounts that might lead us to a better understanding of the world and ourselves and that might help us to lead richer lives" (39), as opposed to debunking their views as ideologies that support structures of dominance and oppression. This is a methodology that distinguishes her work from that of many others in the social sciences and humanities outside of philosophy.

In Chapter 2, Cline gives an overview of those aspects of Rawls's thought that are most relevant to her comparison, with particular focus on his often-neglected essay, "The Sense of Justice." Rawls writes that "it seems almost certain that at least the vast majority of mankind has a capacity for a sense of justice and that, for all practical purposes, one may safely assume that all men originally possess it" (98).[6] Rawls goes on to argue that, while all humans have this capacity, it needs to be cultivated, and the foundation of this cultivation is (almost essentially) the combination of love and moral guidance given to children by parents in a healthy family. This initial foundation must then be extended gradually outward from the family, first to associates in the communities of which one is a part, and then to everyone in the world. (Informed students of Chinese philosophy will recognize that this is startlingly similar to the notion of ethical "extension" that is suggested by some Confucian texts.) Rawls's account of the cultivation of a sense of justice is central to his position, because it is the possibility of a citizenry with a robust sense of justice that makes a just society a practical goal.

Chapter 3 introduces some of the key concepts and claims in the Confucian Analects, and then turns to a discussion of passages that Cline argues illustrate the concept of justice and the sense of justice. I found this chapter to be impressive in many of its details but perhaps not convincing in its general conclusion. Following her in her quest to find the concept of justice in theAnalects led to many interesting revelations. For example, I only noticed with Cline's help how striking it is that Confucius said that good rulers "are not concerned [so much] about poverty, but about unequal distribution. If wealth is equally distributed, there should be no poverty" (133, citing Analects 16.1, Cline's brackets). In addition, she provides an outstanding discussion of the infamous passage (Analects 13.18) in which Confucius condemns a son who turned in his father for taking a sheep that belonged to someone else (157-163). She argues that Confucius does not claim that filial piety trumps justice, and in so doing Cline shows a firm grasp of Classical Chinese, as well as an intimate familiarity with the commentarial tradition. Indeed, she provides one of the best accounts of this passage that I have read. Overall, though, I remain unsure whether it is illuminating to say that Confucius discussed a concept of justiceeven in a thin sense. Certainly, Confucius and Rawls both think there are right and wrong ways to distribute wealth, power, and prestige. But Confucius does not think of this as a distinct issue within morality, the way that Western philosophers since Aristotle have treated distributive justice as a topic in its own right. So do we gain any insight by saying that Rawls and Confucius share a thin concept of justice as opposed to a thin concept of morality?

In Chapter 4, Cline turns to an explicit comparison of the views of Rawls and Confucius on a sense of justice. She makes an excellent case that the Confucian tradition supplies valuable resources for critiquing and supplementing Rawls's account of moral development. More specifically, Rawls states that all humans have a "capacity" to develop a sense of justice. However, scholars of Chinese thought will immediately wonder whether Rawls means by this a capacity for moral cultivation in the sense envisioned by Mengzi or that envisioned by Xunzi (two Confucians who disagreed over the proper way to interpret Confucius's account of moral cultivation). For Xunzi, cultivating morality in humans is like grinding a rough piece of jade into a beautiful statue, while Mengzi envisions moral cultivation as like tending sprouts so that they grow into flourishing trees. Xunzi's account might seem attractively minimalist: it does not assume that human nature has any innate, active, moral propensities. However, it generates a paradox. Once one generation of humans has been morally cultivated, they can cultivate the next generation. But how does the very first generation of humans become morally cultivated? Mengzi's account evades this problem, by arguing for the existence of innate but incipient dispositions toward compassion and ethical shame. Mengzi and the later Confucians who follow him develop an elaborate view of how these incipient dispositions become full-fledged virtues.[7] Cline argues that a Mengzian account is both most consistent with what Rawls does say, and makes the best sense of his position overall.

Cline discusses the contemporary relevance and public policy implications of the views of Rawls and Confucius in Chapter 5. She makes many intriguing suggestions, but I was struck by two in particular. She presents the Nurse-Family Partnership (NFP) as something that "helps to illustrate the sort of public policy that Confucian views of the family would commend" (224). The NFP "provides first-time, low-income mothers with home visits from public health nurses beginning early in pregnancy and continuing through the first two years of the child's life" (220). The nurses provide information on prenatal care and early childhood health, but also provide guidance in how parents should "provide sensitive and competent caregiving" to their children, and develop more productive life-plans, "including completing their education, finding work, and engaging in family planning" (220). There is considerable empirical evidence over the program's thirty-five year history that it reduces child abuse as well as arrests and convictions (among both mothers and their teenage children), promotes employment and family stability, and improves children's emotional and language development and school-readiness (322-323n23). Part of what is important from a Confucian perspective is that the nurses do not just supply value-neutral information: "a sizable number of mothers reported that they had never before experienced the sort of consistent care and support they received from the nurse-visitor. . . . The nurses serve not only as teachers but offers models or paradigms for how to care" (223).

A second point that Cline makes in Chapter 5 that especially interested (and amused) me was one of her illustrations of the continuing influence of Confucian ideas on Chinese society. U.S. and Chinese preschoolers were asked for their responses to two stories. In both stories, the protagonist tries to learn something challenging, but in one story the protagonist works hard and succeeds, while in the other he gives up and fails. The result?

Almost all of the U.S. children liked both protagonists, and a majority of U.S. children gave personal attraction reasons for liking both of them (e.g., "I like the bear because she is cute") . . . . In contrast, more than half of the Chinese children did not like the protagonist who gave up, and when asked why, 77 percent of them gave virtue reasons or reasons related to diligence, persistence, or concentration, (235)

This study helps to demonstrate that the Confucian emphasis on the importance of the virtues and on the possibility of personal transformation continue to exert an important and distinctive influence on contemporary Chinese culture.[8] (It also makes me wish I taught in China.)

A brief review like this cannot do justice (no pun intended) to the wealth of insights in Cline's book. I will close by mentioning one more. Cline states:

The fact that Western philosophical traditions are . . . a central part of how philosophers are educated and evaluated, while non-Western traditions have been excluded in both thought and practice from most philosophy departments, can be understood only as a form of institutionalized prejudice. (42)

She's right. I hope her own excellent comparative work will help bring more mainstream philosophers to this recognition.

[1] Quoting Rawls, A Theory of Justice, rev. ed. (Cambridge: Belknap Press of Harvard University, 1999), p. 5.

[2] Lee H. Yearley, Mencius and Aquinas: Theories of Virtue and Conceptions of Courage. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990.

[3] Martha C. Nussbaum, "Non-Relative Virtues: An Aristotelian Approach," in Ethical Theory: Character and Virtue, vol. 13 of Midwest Studies in Philosophy, ed. Peter French, Theodore Uehling, and Howard Wettstein. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1988, pp. 32-53.

[4] Karen L. Carr and Philip J. Ivanhoe, The Sense of Antirationalism: The Religious Thought of Zhuangzi and Kierkegaard. Reprint, Charleston: CreateSpace, 2010.

[5] Aaron Stalnaker, Overcoming Our Evil: Human Nature and Spiritual Exercises in Xunzi and Augustine. Washington: Georgetown University Press, 2006.

[6] Quoting Rawls, "The Sense of Justice," in Collected Papers, ed. Samuel Freeman. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1999, p. 114.

[7] For a survey of views, see Philip J. Ivanhoe, Confucian Moral Self Cultivation, 2nd ed. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 2000.

[8] Alasdair MacIntyre has made the intriguing suggestion that the de-emphasis of the cultivation of the virtues in the modern West is related to the rejection of Aristotelian science, for which the potentiality/actuality distinction is central. In other words, along with rejecting, properly, virtus dormitiva explanations in natural science, Westerners began to neglect discussions of the human potential for virtue. See MacIntyre, After Virtue, 2nd ed. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1984, p. 54.