Consciousness and Physicalism: A Defense of a Research Program

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Andreas Elpidorou and Guy Dove, Consciousness and Physicalism: A Defense of a Research Program, Routledge, 2018, 225pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138928053.

Reviewed by Andrew Melnyk, University of Missouri


After an introductory chapter, the book falls into two roughly equal parts. In the first (chapters 2-4), Andreas Elpidorou and Guy Dove argue that physicalism should be viewed as a research program, rather than as a comprehensive thesis about what the world is like. In the second part ( chapters 5-7), they ask whether phenomenal consciousness will pose an insuperable obstacle for this research program, and they conclude with the optimistic view that it will not. The book is therefore an unorthodox defense of physicalism about phenomenal consciousness. The view defended deserves the airing it gets in this book; but I suspect that it will strike orthodox physicalists as thin gruel, and orthodox anti-physicalists as simply lowering the bar for the success of physicalism.

The authors' contrast between viewing physicalism as a thesis and viewing it as a research program is not as sharp as may at first appear. To start with, viewing physicalism as a research program in the way that they do requires something like a thesis of physicalism. Their physicalist research program has an aim: "to explain all phenomena that are apt for explanation in a manner that renders them physical" (p. 15). There is therefore a thesis that is true if, and only if, this aim is achieved: the thesis that all phenomena that are apt for explanation have an explanation that renders them physical. This thesis certainly resembles a traditional formulation of physicalism, especially once "renders them physical" has been spelled out. Of course, the authors, in endorsing their physicalist research program, certainly don't have to assert that this thesis is true, or assign it a high probability. But they also can't treat it as a mere guess. They must think that current evidence raises the probability of the thesis a bit, and indeed raises its probability higher than it raises the probability of any thesis describing the completion of any rival non-physicalist research program. But if so, the authors resemble orthodox thesis-physicalists, who hold that a certain thesis of physicalism is rendered more probable by current evidence, and indeed rendered more probable by that evidence than any rival thesis of comparable scope (though still perhaps not rendered probable; see Melnyk 2003, 223-237). The authors may differ from orthodox thesis-physicalists only by assigning to a thesis of physicalism a lower probability on the evidence. Coming at things from the other direction, viewing physicalism as a thesis in the traditional way suggests a constraint on the conduct of scientific research, since to the extent that we have evidence that physicalism is true, to that same extent we have reason to pursue hypotheses that would if true exhibit phenomena of interest as ultimately physical; and (conversely) we have reason not to pursue hypotheses that wouldn't. That sounds like a sort of research program.

To make readers more receptive to their research-program view of physicalism, Elpidorou and Dove devote chapters two and three to criticizing extant attempts to formulate traditional theses of physicalism. Though in part these chapters present more or less familiar objections, in part they are novel. The novelty, however, did not usually persuade me. In chapter two, for example, they criticize the various attempts that have been made to characterize the relation (e.g., supervenience, realization, a priori derivability) that must hold between the apparently non-physical (e.g., the mental) and the unimpeachably physical in order for the existence of the former to be compatible with physicalism. One of these attempts is my own proposal to formulate physicalism as the thesis that (speaking very loosely) everything is either physical in its own right or else is functional (roughly in the sense of higher-order) but realized by something that is physical in its own right, solely in virtue of physical laws (Melnyk 2003, ch. 1). Elpidorou and Dove regard it as afflicted with the fatal defect that "[functional properties, e.g., mental ones] are not nothing over and above the physical, even if in our world tokens of those properties are physically realized by tokens of physical types" (pp. 41-42). Probably everyone who has ever tried to formulate a version of physicalism would agree that physicalism must entail that the non-physical is in some sense nothing over and above the physical. But Elpidorou and Dove never explain why physicalism must entail that non-physical properties are nothing over and above physical properties in a sense stronger than the one expressed by the claim that every instance of every non-physical property is in fact physically realized. We can easily envisage a more demanding formulation of physicalism than mine, a strongly reductive one which disallows any mental properties distinct from physical properties; but it doesn't follow that my less-demanding formulation is not still sufficient for physicalism. Elpidorou and Dove themselves note at the end of their book that there is no one true formulation of physicalism (p. 215); but in that case I don't see what warrant there is for the constraint that rules out my formulation (and others' formulations).[1]

Be that as it may, let me turn to the central chapter four, in which the authors elaborate their idea of physicalism as a research program. Their guiding idea is that there is "an explanatory notion of over-and-aboveness" (p. 127), i.e., that the claim that the apparently non-physical is nothing over and above the physical can be spelled out in terms of explanation, and hence (they think) non-metaphysically, without appealing to such relations as identity, realization, supervenience, or a priori entailment, relations that in chapter two were argued not to be up to the job. Elpidorou and Dove's specific claim is that physicalism is "an interdisciplinary research program that aims to explain all phenomena that are apt for explanation in a manner that renders them physical" (p. 15). Whether this claim is plausible obviously depends on what sort of explanations they have in mind. They characterize such explanations as compositional -- that is, as explanations in terms of the components of the phenomenon to be explained. "Compositional explanations are ones that make intelligible how the target phenomenon (the 'whole') arises out of the workings of its components ('parts')" (p. 16), and "Successful compositional explanations demonstrate how one phenomenon is determined by the workings of its components" (p. 95). This determination (or "necessitation"; p. 95), however, is merely "natural or nomological" (p. 95): "given the laws of nature and certain conditions, the presence of lower-level entities suffices for the target phenomenon" (p. 95). Furthermore, "If a phenomenon (e.g., a biological phenomenon) is compositionally explained and its components are physical, then the phenomenon itself is physically explained . . ." (p. 93). Elpidorou and Dove's view is clearly that a phenomenon is rendered physical (as they put it) if it is physically explained.

But is there really a good sense in which a phenomenon is rendered physical -- revealed to be physical -- if it is physically explained? (Is there really "an explanatory notion of over-and-aboveness"?) Only if there is can the authors' proposed research program be seen as a kind of physicalism (albeit a non-standard one). So in what sense is a phenomenon rendered physical if it is physically explained? The answer to this question never became clear to me. A partial answer is tolerably clear: if a phenomenon is physically explained (in the authors' intended sense), then the phenomenon has a decomposition into physical components. Hence, if every phenomenon (that is apt for explanation) is physically explained, then every phenomenon (that is apt for explanation) has a decomposition into physical components. And that certainly sounds like the sort of thing a physicalist would say about entities. But what about properties? How is a property rendered physical if it is physically explained? Neither properties nor property-instances can at all naturally be said to have components, so the answer can't just be a repetition of the answer given for entities; and anyway the authors show no sign of wanting to give such an answer. So what is their answer? At one point they remark that "The electrical conductivity of graphite (a property) is compositionally explained either in terms of individuals (carbon atoms) and their properties or in terms of a process (flow of phonons)" (p. 94). From this remark, and their silence otherwise, I infer that their answer is two-fold: (i) a property of a target phenomenon is physically explained if (given the laws of nature) it is determined or necessitated by facts about the physical components of the target phenomenon (plus certain conditions); and (ii) a property of a target phenomenon is rendered physical if it is so determined or necessitated.

But whether this answer is satisfactory depends on what kind of determination or necessitation the authors have in mind. They are admirably clear that it is "natural or nomological" (p. 95). But there are importantly different kinds of laws, and they leave unspecified what sort of laws they think do or might underwrite this "natural or nomological" (p. 95) determination or necessitation (under certain conditions) of a target phenomenon by the workings of its physical components. As a result, they must, I fear, confront a serious dilemma. On the one hand, these laws might include fundamental laws of emergence. But if a property of a target phenomenon is only determined or necessitated by physical facts (plus certain conditions) given some fundamental law of emergence, then the property can't be either a physical property or a functional (but physically realized) property. For if it was either, then the law of emergence could be explained, and wouldn't be fundamental. But then in what sense, if any, has the property of the target phenomenon been rendered physical by being physically explained? The answer is not obvious. After all, assume property dualism is true; then my sensing redly isn't rendered physical just because it's determined or necessitated by my being in a certain purely physical brain state a moment earlier.[2] On the other hand -- this is the second horn of the dilemma -- the laws underwriting the "natural or nomological" determination of a target phenomenon might be restricted to physical laws, so that fundamental laws of emergence play no role in the kind of physical compositional explanation that allegedly renders an explanandum physical. But this alternative is no better for the authors. For the only condition under which the workings of a target phenomenon's physical components (given certain circumstances) can determine or necessitate a property of the target phenomenon given only physical laws is if the property is a physical property or is a functional but physically realized property. But what the authors want above all to avoid saying is that apparently non-physical phenomena stand in some such metaphysical relation as identity or realization to physical phenomena. Appealing to such metaphysical relations is what defines the "metaphysical conceptions of physicalism" (p. 15) that they reject in chapter two. Perhaps there is "an explanatory notion of over-and-aboveness"; but that it can avoid metaphysical commitments has not been shown.

There is a reason why Elpidorou and Dove leave unspecified what sort of laws they think do or might underwrite the "natural or nomological" (p. 95) determination or necessitation at the heart of their compositional explanations. They are methodological naturalists who want an account of physicalism that reflects actual scientific practice. They notice that scientific explanations in textbooks and elsewhere mention laws, but they notice too that such explanations don't mention the sort of metaphysical relations invoked in traditional formulations of physicalism: "No . . . metaphysical connections are cited as part of compositional explanations when scientists provide such explanations" (p. 100). But the quoted claim is not obviously true. It is indeed obvious that scientists don't employ the jargon of professional metaphysicians in framing their explanations, but they are unaware of such jargon and unwilling to acquaint themselves with it. Cognitive scientists, however, have long been fond of the idea that the relation of mind to brain is analogous to that of software to computer hardware -- which suggests to me that they envisage a more intimate relation between mind and brain than (philosophical) emergentism would allow. And it is hard for me to believe that a physical chemist giving a compositional explanation of diamond's brightness of the sort that the authors present (on pp. 88-91) would deny making some assumption to the effect that brightness is a matter of the behavior of photons -- or at least that they would deny assuming that there is some such true claim to that effect. Finally, naturalistic philosophers are permitted at least to try arguing that understanding inter-level relations in terms of such metaphysical relations as realization makes the best overall sense of the explanations that scientists explicitly state (Melnyk 2003, ch. 6). In one passage, the authors seem to acknowledge this as a bare possibility (p. 96); but they dismiss it as "doing metaphysics". However, if it employs an acknowledged form of scientific reasoning (e.g., inference to the best explanation), then I do not see that it is bad metaphysics.

The second half of the book argues that phenomenal consciousness provides no grounds for pessimism about the prospects of the physicalist research program articulated in its first half. The authors diagnose familiar consciousness-based arguments against physicalism (the explanatory gap argument, the knowledge argument, and the zombie argument) as resting on the undefended assumption that there is a permanent explanatory gap -- that there can never be a physical explanation of phenomenal consciousness. And in chapters five and six they strive to undermine four arguments that might be offered in support of this assumption. The arguments are (i) a Nagelian argument from subjectivity, (ii) an argument from the alleged failure of phenomenal consciousness to be inter-subjective, (iii) an argument from the alleged impossibility of knowledge of the intrinsic character of properties, and (iv) a related argument from the premise that physics can only account for structure and dynamics. The authors' critical discussions of these arguments are searching and generally persuasive. The highlight of the second half of the book for me, however, was the proposed explanation in chapter seven of why consciousness persistently strikes us as non-physical, and would still do so even if it were physically explained. According to a well-known suggestion, there is, in effect, something it's like to think about a phenomenal state (= a certain brain state, for physicalism) by using a phenomenal concept, but nothing it's like to think about the very same state by using a physical concept, so that we tend to conclude that the physical concept can't possibly be referring to the phenomenal state. The authors' intriguing and empirically grounded proposal is that it's almost the other way around: various kinds of phenomenal states are typically activated when we deploy a physical concept, whereas typically just one is activated when we deploy a phenomenal concept.

The publishers should be congratulated on the external appearance of the book; but they should have hired a copy-editor.


Melnyk, Andrew. 2003. A Physicalist Manifesto: Thoroughly Modern Materialism. New York: Cambridge University Press.

[1] Actually, Elpidorou and Dove don't think that physicalism can be formulated as the thesis that every property is identical with a physical property. They think that, because identity is a symmetrical relation, it cannot articulate the idea that the physical is prior to the non-physical. But their reason is unconvincing. The physical can still be prioritized by formulating physicalism as the claim that, while every mental (biological, geological, etc.) property is identical with a physical property, not every physical property is identical with a mental (biological, geological, etc.) property.

[2] On p. 217, Elpidorou and Dove explicitly disavow emergentism (or rather the emergentist analog to their research-program physicalism). But they don't explain why a compositional explanation in terms of physical components that relies on a fundamental law of emergence would not count as a physical explanation by their lights. Perhaps they would prefer the second horn of the dilemma.