Consciousness and the Self: New Essays

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JeeLoo Liu and John Perry (eds.), Consciousness and the Self: New Essays, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 260pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107000759.

Reviewed by Joel Smith, University of Manchester


The authors in this collection pursue a number of questions concerning self-consciousness, self and consciousness. Although the essays range rather broadly, there is a good deal of unity. In her introduction Liu organises the chapters under three headings: the Humean denial of self-awareness, the issue of self-knowledge, and the nature of persons or selves. This is helpful although it is worth bearing in mind that some chapters fall under more than one heading (for example, Shoemaker) and some don't fall neatly under any (for example, O'Brien).

Another way of relating the topics takes as central the notion of a de se representation, a representation manifestly about oneself (oneself as oneself, as it's sometimes put). Concerning these we can ask what distinguishes them from representations that 'just happen to be' about oneself (Perry); whether they hold the key to understanding phenomenal consciousness (Rosenthal, Kriegel); whether they are based on, or otherwise related to, a special sort of awareness we have of ourselves (Rosenthal, Perry, Prinz, Shoemaker); whether, and how, some subset of them enjoys a privileged epistemic status (Dretske, Schwitzgebel, Byrne, Shoemaker); what role they play in our normative lives (O'Brien, Schwitzgebel); and how they relate to our nature as persons -- what it is that makes us the sorts of things we are, and the particular people we are (Shoemaker, Flanagan). Like all such principles of unity, this isn't perfect, but it seems to me not a bad way to think of the collection as a whole.

I'll lay my cards on the table right away and say that this is a good book. It's not too often that I read a collection such as this cover to cover, and I found doing so with this volume very rewarding. The book contains plenty of chewy philosophical argumentation and the, admittedly only occasional, references between papers were illuminating. There's a lot to learn, and to engage with, here.

It's a good book but I think it's fair to say that it's not an outstanding one, which is something of a disappointment given that the contents page reads like a Who's Who of self-consciousness studies. So let me begin with a criticism that, whilst perhaps a little unfair, is pertinent for the prospective reader. This is that the subtitle of the collection, "New Essays", is in some cases rather misleading. A number of the authors spend a significant amount of time summarising their own views, views with which many readers will be familiar from elsewhere. The worst offenders here are Perry and Shoemaker, but others are guilty to a lesser extent. That's not to question the quality of the arguments presented, which, in these two cases, is unimpeachable. And every chapter contains sufficient material to make it a worthwhile read in its own right. Of course a certain amount of scene setting is necessary for the discussion to follow -- hence the unfairness -- and a number of papers are 100% bona fide fresh out of the box (for example Byrne and O'Brien), but whilst all the essays are new releases, some are, to some extent, re-makes. When considering whether to fork out $90, that matters.

General griping over, in what follows I am going to focus on what is perhaps the book's central theme: the Humean denial of self-awareness. Aside from the intrinsic interest of this question, it is potentially significant for a number of areas of philosophy. To take two very different examples, Hume's denial that we are self-aware plays a crucial role in Kant's (1781, B278)Refutation of Idealism, and Kripke's (1982, Postscript)formulation of the conceptual problem of other minds. At the end I comment on another issue, that of self-knowledge.


As everyone knows, in the Treatise Hume made the following remark,

There are some philosophers, who imagine we are every moment intimately conscious of what we call our SELF; that we feel its existence and its continuous existence . . . For my part, when I enter most intimately into what I call myself, I always stumble on some particular perception or other, of heat or cold, light or shade, love or hatred, pain or pleasure. I never can catch myself at any time without a perception, and never can observe anything but the perception. (Hume 1739, 251-2)

Notoriously, Hume does not tell us which philosophers he intends, but the finger is often pointed at Descartes. For example, in her introduction to the volume, Liu writes that, "Descartes' famous cogito, ergo sum points out the necessary presence of a self in consciousness" (p.1), and in his chapter, Prinz claims that, "In saying 'I think' in the first person, and declaring that this is indubitable, Descartes implies that there is an I, which is directly accessed in consciousness . . . we find an I in experience whenever we think" (pp.125-6). But as an interpretation of Descartes, this is highly contentious. On the face of it, the cogito relies on no such inner awareness of the self, but rather the claim that to doubt that one doubts is self-defeating and that if I am doubting then I must exist. That's not to say that Descartes' reasoning is sound (although I think it is), just that it doesn't seem to rely on the sort of self-awareness that Hume denies (for, in my view, a more plausible interpretation of the cogito, see the opening remarks of Dretske's chapter in this volume).

Whoever Hume had in mind, and Locke is the other leading candidate, a number of philosophers have subsequently unambiguously asserted that there is such a self-awareness which, following Shoemaker (Shoemaker 1987), I take to involve an inner awareness of the self as an object. Examples include Bertrand Russell (1910), Roderick Chisholm (1969)and Quassim Cassam (1995). We can insert Rosenthal's chapter into that list. Opposing him are Prinz, Shoemaker and, although he is not explicit about it, I would add Perry.

Rosenthal's distinctive take on this debate is that Hume, due to his empiricist commitments, wrongly assumes that self-awareness would have to be sensory in character. On Rosenthal's view, however, one can be aware of oneself by having an appropriate thought of oneself for, "perceiving is not the only way we are aware of things. We are also aware of something when we have a thought about that thing as being present to us" (p.23). A subset of such thoughts, those about our first-order psychological states, are, according to Rosenthal's Higher-Order Thought theory, constitutive of phenomenal consciousness. So, the plausibility of the HOT theory shows that Hume was wrong. Now, of course, anyone who accepts that there are de se thoughts is likely to accept that one can think a thought about something as present to oneself. A nice example might be O'Brien's insightful characterisation of 'ordinary self-consciousness', of feeling self-conscious, as involving a consciousness, "that it is me that is the focus of others' awareness" (p.112). Surely Shoemaker, Prinz and others that have concurred with Hume would not deny the possibility of such a thing. Yet this would seem to involve the thought that I myself am present to myself. Much rides, then, on the claim that this is, in an interesting and relevant sense, a way of being aware of something. Unfortunately, this isn't a claim that Rosenthal defends or even explains in any detail. Not here at least.

Arguably, Kriegel's Self-Representational account of phenomenal consciousness could be classed alongside Rosenthal's in this context, as disputing the Humean denial. Indeed, this seems to be how it is interpreted by Prinz (p.127), although it is not how Kriegel himself describes the view (his excellent, albeit highly concessive paper is concerned primarily with the prospects for an epistemic reduction of phenomenal consciousness). Further, it might be thought that this account is not subject to the above worry. For, since Kriegel's is a view on which conscious psychological states (some of which will be sensory) represent themselves, then it may seem that we have here a sensory representation of the self, the sort of self-awareness that Hume disputes.

It's not obvious to me, however, that this is the right way to read Kriegel's account. For he describes self-representation as that which grounds a, "direct presence, a subjective significance, of the experience to the subject" (p.53). It would take a further argument to show that this amounts to a direct presence of the subject to herself.

On the opposing side we have Prinz, who offers both a useful way of mapping the different approaches to the Humean position and a critical discussion of various empirical attempts to support self-awareness, and Shoemaker, who reminds us of his argument for the Humean denial based upon the claim that there are (and must be) some de se thoughts that are immune to error through misidentification relative to the first person pronoun. I'll focus on Shoemaker. In short, he argues that if there were an inner awareness of the self one would need to know that it was oneself of which one was aware. That is, the self would need to be identified. But since identification carries with it the possibility of misidentification, self-awareness cannot ground those de se thoughts that are immune to such errors. As Shoemaker puts it, "it cannot be the case that such judgments are grounded on observing a self, identified as oneself, having whatever state is self-ascribed by the judgement" (p.203).

Now the first thing that might be pointed out is that this line of reasoning, even if cogent, does not support the contention that there is no such thing as self-awareness, but merely the claim that if there is such a thing it does not ground those de se thoughts that are immune to error through misidentification.

Another query might be how, if we lack an awareness of the self, such thoughts are grounded? For the idea that we have thoughts that are necessarily about ourselves, but that are not grounded on an awareness of ourselves as being some way, might seem mysterious. One possibility is Perry's idea of a "necessarily self-informative method" (94-5) and the related notion of an unarticulated constituent (although Perry does not link this discussion into the more general reflections on the Humean denial, he does present it, in my opinion, as a compelling explanation of immunity to error). The idea here is that there is a way of finding out (e.g., that a person is in pain) that is necessarily limited to the states of a single thing -- oneself. This guarantees immunity to error and, since the self is the object of one's thought as a result of the, "architecture of the relational system" (p.89), the way is opened up for the self to be an unarticulated constituent in one's thought content. Pursuing this thought, perhaps something along these lines would be the best way to square the Humean denial of self-awareness with the view, attractive to a number of philosophers (for example, (Bermúdez 2000)), that some sensory states can have de se content.

Rosenthal takes a more direct line against Shoemaker, arguing, in effect, that no de se thoughts are immune in this way. Rosenthal's case is based on general theoretical grounds (explicitly challenged by Perry in his chapter), but he also provides a counterexample to the claim that "I have a pain" is so immune. The example concerns Dissociative Identity Disorder. The assumption -- controversial enough, but let us grant it -- is that this condition involves different persons ('alters') occupying a single body. The idea, then, is that, "some alters have access not only to their own memories and experiences, but to those of others as well" (p.43). Rosenthal then argues that alter A can be aware of alter B's pain, but mistakenly think that it is her own pain. The resulting judgement, "I am in pain" would rest on an error of misidentification.

It is, however, far from clear that an alter that is not in pain could have the relevant access to the pain of another. Surely the most intuitive thing to say in such a case is that the two share a pain? In defence of his interpretation, Rosenthal points out that the pain may be "integrated into the mental life and behaviour" of B but not A. But this seems insufficient to the task. The claim must be that A is aware, from the inside, of B's pain, but is not herself in pain. But what more is needed to be in pain than to feel, from the inside, a pain? I see no reason, at least on the face of it, to suppose that the pain must be 'integrated' any more than by being so felt.


I turn to the idea that some de se thoughts are epistemically privileged. We typically suppose that we have a way of coming to know facts about our own conscious mental life that is very different from the ways we have of coming to know facts about that of others. We also tend to suppose that this is an especially reliable way of gaining knowledge. Finally, it is taken for granted by pretty much everybody that not only are we pretty reliable on what is going on in our conscious mental life, we are damn sure that we have one. To pick an example that brings us back to Descartes' cogito, we find no room to doubt that we are thinking.

The chapters by Dretske and Schwitzgebel challenge some central aspects of these apparent truisms. The chapter by Byrne sets out to explain some others. In his characteristically well-argued paper Dretske defends the remarkable claim that my knowledge that I am thinking is no more direct or secure than is someone else's knowledge that I am thinking. His argument is complex but involves the thought that knowing something requires a subject to be aware of something that gives her a reason to believe that thing. Further, merely thinking that P does not give a subject a reason to believe that she is thinking that P, since all she is aware of is the proposition, that P. Therefore, thinking that P is not sufficient for knowing that one is thinking. Now, Dretske makes it clear that he is assuming that, in thinking that P, we are not aware of an "internal event or condition - [our] own act of thinking" (p.163), and he identifies this with the rejection of an inner sense, or quasi-perceptual, account of how we know that we are thinking. But this seems too quick. For it may be that one's conscious act of thinking, not a quasi-perceptual awareness of it, is itself the reason to believe that one is thinking (Peacocke 1999, Ch.5). That is, on such a view, Dretske is wrong to suppose that a rejection of inner sense entails that all that one is aware of when thinking that P is the proposition that P, for one is also aware of one's consciously thinking that P. Now, Dretske may object that this is to suppose a quite implausible phenomenology of thought (p.162), but I must confess that I cannot really begin to understand the claim that there is nothing it is like to think. To steal a line from Hume, "All I can allow him is, that he may be in the right as well as I, and that we are essentially different in this particular" (Hume 1739, 252).

Taken together with Dretske's, Schwitzgebel's fascinating chapter might be thought to support Nietzsche's claim that, "We are unknown to ourselves, we knowers" (Nietzsche 1887, 3). Schwitzgebel argues not that we don't know that we are thinking, but that we don't know what we are thinking. As Schwitzgebel puts it, "we do not know our stream of consciousness or our own attitudes very well at all" (p.185). His argument is based on a combination of general observations and empirical studies, and much of it is convincing. I just want to suggest two things.

First, when it comes to our attitudes, I suspect that a good many philosophers that are impressed with our capacity for self-knowledge and seek to explain it, would be entirely comfortable with many of the negative claims that Schwitzgebel makes. Our knowledge of whether we are sexists, of what our most deeply held values are, and of what character traits we possess are not typically considered good cases of privileged self-knowledge, which is usually limited to knowledge of our current conscious mental episodes. Now Schwitzgebel puts these latter aside as "fairly trivial" (p.191), allowing that our knowledge of such attitudes is safe. But this is unfair. In his influential account of how knowledge of our current beliefs is possible, one that Schwitzgebel endorses (p.191), Evans (1982, 225)employs the example of my knowledge of whether or not I believe that there will be a Third World War. How trivial is that? Admittedly, it may not be the sort of knowledge with which the Delphic Oracle is concerned, but the whole point of the Delphic injunction was that such self-knowledge is hard, and philosophers haven't typically wanted to dispute that.

Second, when it comes to our conscious sensory states -- be it visual experience, visual imagery or emotional state -- Schwitzgebel argues that our knowledge is limited to a certain level of generality, or indeterminacy. I may know that I am having a visual experience as of a red ball but the exact detail of the shade, shape and location of the appearing object escapes me. All I wish to point out is that there are two possibilities with respect to what is going on here and that Schwitzgebel, in talking of self-ignorance, presupposes one of them. This is that such experiences have a fine-grained, determinate phenomenology of which we are ignorant. But the alternative explanation is that such experiences have only a course-grained, indeterminate phenomenal character. I am not asserting that this latter possibility is the right one, although for the case of mental imagery I find it plausible, just that if the determinacy of our knowledge tracks the determinacy of our experiences, then to speak of self-ignorance is misleading.

Finally, I turn to Byrne's inventive and well-argued chapter. Even Schwitzgebel accepts that some of our, albeit trivial, de se attitudes have a special epistemic status. For example, I know that I currently believe that I am typing and, according to Byrne's Evansian approach, I come to such knowledge by following this rule,

BEL: If p, believe that you believe that p. (p.171)

BEL has the virtue that, in following it one can never be led astray. (Incidentally, this suggests another response to Dretske. Try following this rule, you'll not go far wrong, THINK: If P, then believe that you are thinking). In his chapter Byrne turns to our knowledge of our current desires, arguing for the centrality for the analogous,

DES: If ϕing is a desirable option, believe that you want to ϕ. (p.177)

Whilst following DES may lead one to false beliefs about what one desires -- for example Byrne offers a case in which one knows that ϕing is desirable but, due to apathy, one fails to desire it (one might also offer any number of cases in which one judges that ϕing is desirable, yet knows it to be impossible. Arguably, one does not desire the unattainable, one wishes for it) -- it is reliable enough for its deliverances to count as knowledge. The fact that the account is nicely unified with BEL also counts in its favour.

Byrne's leaning upon a connection between judging that something is desirable and desiring it puts him in good company. Anscombe, for example, suggested that the intelligibility of saying, "I want a saucer of mud" depended on one's being prepared to offer some desirability characteristic in response to the question, "What for?". Byrne doesn't quite say this, but he does say that typically, one's privileged knowledge of one's current desires is attained by following DES (p.177). It would be a problem for Byrne, then, if there were a significant class of desires of which one has privileged knowledge achieved in some way other than by following DES, for this would undermine the unity with BEL. Some philosophers have certainly thought that there are such desires. Lenman, whilst conceding that "I want a saucer of mud" requires further elaboration, maintains that "I desire that a saucer of mud be brought to me and placed in my hands" (Lenman 2006, 39)does not. Or consider an expressive desire, "I want to punch the wall"; or a desire to pick one of several trivial options, "Pick a number between one and ten", "I have a strong desire to say 'seven'"; or a distraught lover expressing his desire thus, "I want to be with her. I know that she is no good, and no good for me. Still I want her." In none of these cases, does it seem that the subject need view the state of affairs as desirable. If such desires are coherent, and I for one would like to be offered some reason to suppose that they are not, then we need to know how it is that their subjects know that they have them. Not, surely by following DES. And, if in some other way, then why think that this is not the way in which we come to know our more reasonable wants?

There is a great deal in the volume that I have not discussed, but I hope to have given a flavour of its contents. It's a good book, with lots of careful papers and serious arguments. Anybody with even a passing interest in self-consciousness, consciousness or the self, cannot fail to learn something from its pages.


Bermúdez, J. L. 2000.  The Paradox of Self-Consciousness. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Cassam, Q. 1995. “Introspection and Bodily Self-ascription.” In The Body and the Self, ed. José Luis Bermúdez, Anthony Marcel, and Naomi Eilan, 311–36. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Chisholm, R. M. 1969. “On the Observability of the Self.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 30 (1): 7–21.

Evans, G. 1982. The Varieties of Reference. Ed. J. McDowell. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Hume, D. 1739.  A Treatise of Human Nature. Ed. L. A. Selby-Bigge and P. H. Nidditch. Second Eidition. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Kant, I. 1781. Critique of Pure Reason. Ed. Paul Guyer and Alan Wood. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Kripke, S. A. 1982. Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language: An Elementary Exposition. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Lenman, J. 2006. “The Saucer of Mud, the Kudzu Vine and the Uxorious Cheetah: Against Neo-Aristotelian Naturalism in Metaethics.” European Journal of Analytic Philosophy 1: 37–50.

Nietzsche, F. W. 1887.  On the Genealogy of Morality. Ed. Keith Ansell-Pearson. Trans. Carol Diethe. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Peacocke, C. 1999. Being Known. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Russell, B. 1910. “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description.”  Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 11: 108–128.

Shoemaker, S. 1987. “Introspection and the Self.” Midwest Studies in Philosophy 10 (1): 101–120.