Contemporary Aristotelian Metaphysics

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Tuomas E. Tahko (ed.), Contemporary Aristotelian Metaphysics, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 263pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107000643.

Reviewed by Robert C. Koons, University of Texas at Austin


In this collection, many of the leaders of the neo-Aristotelian movement in analytic metaphysics have contributed brief papers that point to emerging developments in the field. The book will be of interest to anyone who wants to stay abreast of the progress being made by this significant group. The collection is especially strong on the questions of methodology and ontological categories.

In the first chapter, Kit Fine seeks to define the methodology of Aristotelian metaphysics and to differentiate it from other fields of inquiry. He emphasizes three characteristics of metaphysics: its generality, its focus on the natures of things, and the semantic 'transparency' of metaphysical concepts (excluding the possibility of the discovery of a posteriori necessities that typifies the natural sciences). Fine defends an a priori methodology but fails to clinch the case. Aristotle's own metaphysics seemed to build naturally on a posteriori knowledge of the world, including physics, chemistry, biology and astronomy. Conversely, all branches of knowledge draw to some extent on a priori sources of information, such as logic or mathematics. Contra Fine, it's not clear that metaphysics is more a priori than other fields.

Tuomas Tahko also gives a priority a central role, although he is careful to disavow a commitment to the infallibility of our a priori intuition. Tahko responds to Thomas Hofweber's charge that Aristotelian metaphysics is guilty of 'esotericism', relying on its own self-contained and hence mysterious vocabulary. Tahko persuasively argues that Kit Fine's notions of grounding and ontological priority (which are similar to conceptions of grounding developed by Gideon Rosen and Jonathan Schaffer) are intuitive and available to common sense.

Tahko defends E. J. Lowe's idea that possibility 'precedes' actuality. Lowe's view seems a Platonic rather than an Aristotelian approach to metaphysics. In contrast, Alexander Pruss (Actuality, Possibility, and Worlds, Continuum Books 2011) has shown how to construct metaphysical possibility in terms of actual powers. Pruss's position is much better aligned to Aristotle's position in Metaphysics Theta than is Lowe's. Epistemologically speaking, there is no clear priority in either direction. Instead, there is a dialectical interplay between our knowledge of the possible and of the actual.

Tim Crane, in "Existence and quantification reconsidered", clears up some confusions about Meinong's actual views, distinguishing them from Bertrand Russell's views in The Principles of Mathematics (1903). Meinong's main point was not to distinguish things that exist from things that have 'being' (with the supposition that everything we can think of at least has being). Meinong's actual view was that many things we think of have no being of any kind (a point that has also been pressed in recent years by Graham Priest). The distinction between existence and subsistence was for Meinong something like the modern distinction between concrete and abstract entities, not between existent and non-existent ones. Somewhat surprisingly, Crane's chapter includes no discussion of Meinong's characterization principle (the principle that entails that the F is always an F), which Graham Priest (Towards Non-Being, 2005) has argued is a dispensable and problematic part of Meinong's project.

Eric T. Olson provides a critique of the view, shared by E. J. Lowe, Henry Laycock and Michael Dummett, that stuffs are absolutely "uncountable", in the sense that they are constituted neither by one thing nor by some other number (whether finite or infinite) of things. On this view, there are pieces of stuff (each bordered by a vacuum or by stuffs of other kinds) but no arbitrary "portions" of stuff. In fact, there are no such arbitrary portions or regions of space either: the only regions of space that exist are those that are occupied by some substantial thing or by some discrete piece of stuff. Olson argues that this view collapses into a merely verbal stipulation about the use of the word 'number'. He introduces the word *number* by his own stipulation: x and y are one in *number* iff x and y are identical and two in *number* iff they are distinct. He argues that it follows that portions of stuff can be *numbered*, trivializing the Lowe-Laycock-Dummett thesis. The moral of Olson's argument should be this: defenders of the LLD uncountability thesis must deny that arbitrary portions of stuff bear identity and distinctness relations to one another, which would block Olson's result about *numbering*. This raises two further issues: (1) Do uncountabilists simply deny that there are actual arbitrary portions, insisting that such portions exist only potentially? If so, do such merely potential things fall within the scope of quantification? (2) Do uncountabilists deny that there are any facts about the persistence or non-persistence through time of arbitrary portions? These could be combined: we might suppose that arbitrary portions exist only potentially, and that there is no sense in asking whether this potential portion would or would not have been identical to that one.

Gary Rosenkrantz tries to provide necessary, and perhaps jointly sufficient, conditions for something's being an 'ontological category'. He excludes natural kinds on the grounds that they have empirically discoverable natures, whereas supposedly the natures of ontological categories must be wholly transparent to a priori consideration. He also relies heavily on syntax and linguistic senses of words to mark the distinction between categories and non-categories: categories must be represented by nouns, not adjectives, and categories must not be disjunctive or 'synonymous' with disjunctive predicates. This sort of reliance on natural language is problematic, since metaphysical categories might well correspond to disjunctions of noun phrases in any given natural language. Such linguistic criteria are at best fallible indicators of metaphysical categoricality. In fact, they could plausibly be taken as constraints on a metaphysically ideal language, rather than as linguistic clues to metaphysical fact. Can we be confident that English or any other natural language is ideal in this way?

In the next three chapters, the authors criticize E. J. Lowe's four-category ontology. Lowe draws primarily on Aristotle's Categories, with its pair of distinctions: between universal and particular, and between substance and accident or attribute. This gives rise to exactly four categories: particular substances (like Socrates), substantial kinds (like humanity), particular accidents (e.g., Socrates' wisdom or paleness), and universal attributes (wisdom or paleness). Alexander Bird objects on the ground that there is no need for one of the four categories: substantial kinds (Aristotle's "secondary substances"). We can treat such kinds as conjunctions of simple attribute-universals or as structural universals.

Bird considers Lowe's two arguments for kinds, by which he claims a comparative advantage over David Armstrong's two-category ontology (universals and particulars). First, Lowe argues that some scientific laws require kinds: planets travel in ellipses, polar bears are white. Bird responds, plausibly, by questioning whether the kind planets is really needed in stating Kepler's law. Other objects (comets, asteroids, satellites) also satisfy the law. However, Bird doesn't consider the best examples for Lowe: the kinds of fundamental particles. Bird admits that the laws of atomic physics rule out the possibility of an atom with π times the mass of a proton, but this presupposes laws of the form: protons have mass p.

Second, Lowe claims that his account avoids the inference problem. This is a problem that Bas van Fraassen argued afflicts Armstrong's account of the form of laws. On Armstrong's account, the truthmaker of a law consists in a second-order necessitation relation linking two or more universals. Van Fraassen argued that the presence of such a second-order relation cannot logically entail a first-order correlation between instances of the first-order universals. Lowe claimed that his account was superior, since on his view the laws involve actuallypredicating an attribute to a substantial kind. Bird offers here a compelling objection to Lowe. Although Lowe thinks that his view is superior to Armstrong's because on his view only defeasible or 'oaken' generalizations follow from laws, this doesn't help with the inference problem. We are still left with the problem of how to infer, even defeasibly, the conclusion that this particular F is G from the supposition that the kind F is 'characterized by' the attribute G.

Bird's positive argument against Lowe is based on laws like Newton's law of gravitational attraction or Coulomb's law of electrostatic attraction and repulsion. These laws don't involve any kinds, except for very broad kinds, like 'physical object'. As Bird points out, these laws also apply in a non-trivial way to massless and electrically neutral objects. However, this objection is inconclusive. All Lowe needs is that some laws essentially involve kinds, and this seems clear in the case of laws governing the world's fundamental particles, like electrons, photons or quarks.

John Heil ("Are four categories two too many?") raises an interesting problem for Lowe. According to Lowe, both particulars and substantial kinds can be characterized by attributive universals: this ball is spherical, electrons in general are (or the electron is) spherical. In this first case, Lowe supposes that there is an abstract but particular "instance" of the universal, namely, a mode or trope of sphericity, characterizing the particular sphere. Is there also a mode of sphericity characterizing the universal kind electron, and unique to it? There seems to be no room for such a thing in Lowe's scheme, but why suppose that modes characterize substantial particulars but not substantial universals, when in both cases we have one universal attribute characterizing or instantiated in many subjects?

Heil argues that the existence of certain kinds does not explain the non-occurrence of certain combinations of qualities and powers. Lowe would have to say that it is the existence of just these kinds and no others that explains the pattern of coinstantiation of properties. In effect, this makes the non-existence of certain conceivable kinds a lawlike fact about the world.

Lowe's universals are not spatiotemporally located (unlike Armstrong's), but they are immanent in the sense that they 'require' instances (like Armstrong's). Kinds metaphysically depend on their instances, not vice versa. Heil presses: how then can they explain anything? How can their presence in laws be explanatory? One can have primitive powers without universals, as Locke demonstrates. What do universals add?

Heil recommends D. C. Williams's "modest realism": the world consists wholly of particulars, but the particulars are "pregnant with" generality. We can "acknowledge" universals by treating exact similarity as a loose kind of identity relation. This treats kinds as abstractions from concrete particulars, and not as a fundamental ontological category. Heil's critique is trenchant and provocative, but I am left wondering whether the metaphor of pregnant particulars is a sufficiently clear and substantive alternative.

Peter Simons and Joshual Hoffman close out the discussion of ontological categories. Simons argues that we must discern the fundamental "factors" that lie behind each categorial scheme. Hoffman attempts to lay down some necessary conditions for an Aristotelian theory of 'substance'. He defends four criteria: substancehood must be an ontological category, the theory must be largely consistent with common sense, the notion of 'substance' must be analyzable into more fundamental notions, and the substances themselves must be real and irreducible to entities of other categories. By these criteria, the theories of Chisholm, Lowe and Hoffman-Rosenkrantz count as Aristotelian.

Hoffman takes Aristotle to have changed his mind about what is primary ousia (the most fundamental entities) from Categories to Metaphysics: composite substances in the Categories, the forms only in Metaphysics. Hoffman doesn't take into account the distinction between two questions: (i) what things are the primary beings? and (ii) what is the primary being of those primary beings? Aristotle seems to be consistent once this distinction is recognized. The primary beings are the composites, and their forms are the primary being of those composites.

There are two chapters on the metaphysics of biology: Louis Guenin's "Developmental Potential" and Storrs McCall's "The definition of life and the origin of life". Both contain interesting observations, but neither grapples with the two fundamental questions: (i) How do many particles come to form one organism (the problem of composition)? And (ii) what prevents the ontological reduction of biology to chemistry and physics? In my view, an adequate answer to the first would lead to an answer to the second as well.

Guenin understands development in terms of the capacity to acquire a capacity. This is on the right track but is seriously incomplete. An embryo has the 'capacity' in some sense to develop the capacity of nourishing a predator (if eaten), but this surely shouldn't count as a developmental potential.

Guenin models development by means of a probability function, while admitting that C. B. Martin's finking thought-experiments (not to mention the phenomena of reverse finking, masking and mimicking) demonstrate that dispositions are not reducible to conditionals. But Guenin's probability function is simply a generalization of subjunctive conditionals and subject to the very same finking problems.

A Neo-Aristotelian account of development must take teleology more seriously, while avoiding any invocation of a vital force. This is a difficult problem, but Guenin provides no progress toward overcoming it.

McCall argues that organic form must include more than just the DNA sequences in the chromosome. He argues for the indispensability of a 4-dimensional pattern, encoded epigenetically, in explaining both development and repair. McCall appeals to observations by Vance Tartar of the Stentor protozoan, which is able to re-assemble itself when divided into pieces. DNA simply directs the production of proteins, not their arrangement in spacetime processes. McCall suggests resurrecting the idea of a morphogenetic field, a kind of biological 'geodesic'. The relation of the organism to its field would be analogous to the way that physical matter both deforms the curvature of spacetime and follows the geodesic lines within that curvature.

Kathrin Koslicki, in "Essence, necessity and explanation", builds on Kit Fine's distinction between essence and necessity. Koslicki argues that Fine's account misses something crucial in Aristotle's account of explanation (from the Posterior Analytics): we must look not just at what logically follows from essence, but also at the causal direction between the two terms. She mentions the case of the priority of the flagpole's length over the length of its shadow as a parallel, which demonstrated the inadequacy of the deductive-nomological account of explanation. Koslicki discusses a very interesting case: Aristotle's explanation of the multiple stomachs of the camel (in Parts of Animals). This explanation draws on three kinds of facts: teleological facts, facts about the camel's habitat, and facts about the essences of the constitutive materials (earth) in the camel's body. Koslicki's discussion is tantalizing -- a more detailed analysis would be welcome.

David S. Oderberg discusses the causal structuralism ("dispositional monism") of Alexander Bird, and the circularity/vacuity objection posed by E. J. Lowe and Howard Robinson. Surprisingly, Oderberg doesn't mention Sydney Shoemaker,[1] or the fact that Bertrand Russell first formulated the circularity/vacuity objection (in his 1927 The Analysis of Matter). It is also surprising that there's no mention of John Hawthorne's paper on "Causal Structuralism" (in his Metaphysical Essays, Oxford University Press 2006, pp. 213-228, reprinted from Philosophical Perspectives 15, 2001, pp. 361-378), which includes a discussion of the circularity/vacuity objection.

I'm sympathetic to this objection to causal structuralism, but Oderberg doesn't advance the debate to a significant degree, but just repeats, in a variety of ways and in a variety of contexts, the very same objection to circularity, which structuralists like Shoemaker, Bird, and Dipert find unconvincing, resulting in a stalemate. In my view, structuralism is vulnerable to the following objection: perhaps in asymmetric graphs of dispositional connections (i.e., graphs with no non-trivial automorphisms) one might be able to claim with some plausibility (as Bird does) that a node's unique position in the graph grounds its distinctness from the other nodes in the graph, but surely it would be metaphysically possible for the world's causal 'lawbook' (as Hawthorne puts it) to be symmetrical, in which case the distinctness of modes would have to be primitive and intrinsic to certain pairs. If this is how distinctness of properties works in some possible worlds (by way of 'quiddities' or 'sicceities', thusnesses), surely it is most reasonable to suppose that it works that way in every world. Structuralism couldn't be a merely contingent truth about some properties: it must be either necessarily and universally true or necessarily and universally false.

E. J. Lowe, a leading light of the neo-Aristotelian movement, supplies the most interesting piece in the book. Lowe explains that his own four-category ontology owes much to Aristotle's Categories but little to his Metaphysics. Lowe does not make use of Aristotle's matter/form distinction and finds the idea of particular substances as 'composites' of matter and form mysterious and unilluminating. I agree that this language of composition can be somewhat misleading: better to talk of matter and form as two 'factors' or 'explanatory principles' than as 'parts' or 'components', especially since the matter of a substance is merely potential in being.

Lowe employs Wolterstorff's distinction between relational and constituent ontologies, a distinction also associated with recent work by Michael Loux. He denies that his own system falls into either category. However, he does so by giving an uncharitable interpretation of the 'relational ontologist', supposing that the relational ontologist must suppose that the relation of instantiation or exemplification is an external relation between particulars and universals, or even that relational ontologists must reify the relational tie as a kind of mode or trope. However, nearly all relational ontologists, well aware of the threat of Bradley's regress, suppose that exemplification is a merely logical relation, one that resists any reification. In addition, it is quite possible for relational ontologists to take exemplification to be an internal relation, grounded in the natures of the two relata. Admittedly, this leaves them vulnerable to the charge that the universals are then an idle wheel, since the particulars have their character intrinsically. However, they need not suppose that this intrinsic character is explanatorily independent of the holding of the exemplification relation. They shouldn't concede that an 'internal relation' is one that is metaphysically posterior to the characters of the two relata: only that it does not vary from world to world in which the intrinsic characters of the two relata are fixed.

Lowe rejects constituent ontologies as well, denying both that accidental tropes are parts of the substances they characterize, and that universals are parts of the tropes that instantiate them. However, in both cases Lowe supposes there to be a kind of existential rigidity: an accidental trope cannot exist except by characterizing one particular substance, and no trope can exist except by instantiating one unique universal. Tropes are doubly non-transferable for Lowe, having both a fixed subject and a fixed universal character. For Lowe, these are both just brute, inexplicable necessary connections between separate (disjoint) entities. The constituent ontologist seems to have a clear advantage here, since on that view the thick, charactered particular is a whole containing both a bare particular and various universals as parts. If a 'trope' is then identified with sum of a bare particular and a universal, we have a simple explanation of why it is impossible for that very trope to exist without characterizing that particular and instantiating that universal. In addition, we can explain both characterization and instantiating as special cases of the whole-to-proper-part relation, an additional bit of theoretical economy.

[1] ‘Causality and Properties’, in P. van Inwagen (ed.), Time and Cause, Dordrecht: Reidel, 1980, pp. 109–135, and  ‘Causal and Metaphysical Necessity’, Paciļ¬c Philosophical Quarterly79 (1998): 59–77.