Contemporary Feminist Pragmatism

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Maurice Hamington and Celia Bardwell-Jones (eds.), Contemporary Feminist Pragmatism, Routledge, 2012, 279pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415899918.

Reviewed by John Kaag, University of Massachusetts-Lowell


In 1991, Charlene Haddock Seigfreid asked, "Where Are All the Pragmatist Feminists?"[1] In their Introduction, Maurice Hamington and Celia Bardwell-Jones answer her call: "We're Here, We're Here!" (1) They have produced a volume that is as valuable as it is overdue. For a very long time, Seigfried received no response. Pragmatists and feminists spent the better part of the last century on the sidelines of contemporary mainstream philosophy. When they managed to enter the fray, they were often too busy watching their backs to notice that they were not wholly alone. And what this volume makes abundantly clear is that pragmatists and feminists are necessary partners, partners that have slowly forced their way back into mainstream philosophy and aim to make it genuinely world-ready. As one of the contributors, Erin McKenna, stated almost a decade ago, the diverse voices of feminist pragmatism express a common concern, namely to "develop theories that are informed by experience and used to guide action." (2)

This volume consists of fourteen essays, separated into three thematic sections ("Community and Identity," "Political Practice," and "Ethics and Inquiry"). The editors have made an effort to invite well-established scholars as well younger academics who, if given the opportunity, will become the next generation of pragmatist feminists. This approach to fostering philosophical community is in step with the practices of the Society for the Advancement of American Philosophy, an organization that promoted the study of classical American pragmatism well before its recent resurgence in the writing of such figures as Robert Brandom. More specifically, this volume was made possible by the scholars of the Jane Collective, a small but active group of thinkers that cleared a space for feminist scholarship within the field of American philosophy. Indeed, a quick survey of this volume's table of contents will give a reader a good sense of the organization's membership.

Contemporary feminist pragmatism arose as a unique philosophical identity in the 1990s, preserved by specific communities, in the face of marginalizing forces. "Community and Identity," therefore, is an appropriate starting place for this volume that opens with Shannon Sullivan's analysis of marginalization, oppression and identity in the context of race. Sullivan brings contemporary feminist and race theorists such as Naomi Zack, Sandra Harding, Lisa Heldke, and Linda Martin Alcoff into conversation with a relatively obscure and unlikely interlocutor: Josiah Royce. At the turn of the 19th century Royce attempted to bridge the divide between idealism and the pragmatism of Royce's next-door neighbor, William James. Unsurprisingly, this attempt at mediation left Royce open to criticisms from both sides of this philosophical divide. Sullivan, however, sees something very important in Royce's conception of loyalty, namely that it gives us a way of thinking through racial justice, and more particularly, the controversial possibility of "loyalty to whiteness." (31) Allowing whiteness to be an object of Roycean loyalty is, for Sullivan, not an uncritical defense of its hegemony. Indeed, it is precisely the opposite. For Royce, to be loyal, to be loyal to the very concept of loyalty, involves a critical assessment of the way in which the category of whiteness has operated in oppressive and fractious ways.

In the next chapter of the volume, "The Hostile Gospel and Democratic Faith," Denise James provides an interesting counterpoint to Sullivan's analysis of race. James advances a "brand of black feminism" which seeks to "recognize the full humanity and equality of all people regardless of gender, race, class, or sexual orientation." (43) Interestingly, her intent seems to coincide with Sullivan's, but she draws from radically different cultural and philosophical wellsprings for her conclusions. James argues that contemporary rap music can serve as the sort of concrete tool of democratic practice that was proposed by the pragmatist John Dewey by including "both the public critique of society at large and also internal community critiques." (49) James knows that drawing on rap music as the cultural context of feminist reflection is problematic (its misogyny and violence being central to the problem), but argues effectively that such contexts must be negotiated in a genuinely pragmatic philosophical project. Her concrete approach to John Dewey's democratic theory, a theory that has been worked and re-worked in recent years, is a fresh one that, instead of providing yet another take on Dewey, provides a new philosophical take on our current cultural practices. It should be taken seriously as an example of the way that feminist pragmatism can be done.

The pragmatic analysis of race and class provided by Sullivan and James sets the stage for the next three essays that bear on the topic of cross-cultural relations. Pragmatism has always been a philosophy of mediation, identifying common ground between epistemic positions (idealism and empiricism), between political frameworks (liberalism and communitarianism), and between ethical schools (deontology and virtue ethics). Only relatively recently, however, has pragmatism been recognized as a theoretical resource to understand difference, translation, and mediation in culturally diverse communities. This is somewhat surprising since pragmatists such as Jane Addams, John Dewey, George Herbert Mead, W.E.B. DuBois, and Josiah Royce all wrote extensively on the growing diversity of 20th century America. In "Border Communities and Royce," Celia Bardwell Jones argues that Royce's theory of interpretation, adapted from the writings of C.S. Peirce at the end of the 19th century, can operate in a 21st century feminist border analysis. Interestingly, Bardwell Jones believes that Royce can help us extend the recent arguments advanced by Latina feminist theorists, such as Ofelia Schutte and Gloria Anzaldua.

In a similar line of thinking, the next essay by Amrita Banerjee proposes that important lines of thinking in classical American pragmatism are precursors of Chandra Mohanty's Feminism without Borders. Mohanty, along with scholars such as bell hooks and Uma Narayan, have sought answers to a very hard question at the center of recent feminist debates: "How is one to propose a feminist outlook that attends to the existence of borders (national, ethnic, cultural, class) without "endorsing an exclusionary framework in their ethical-political vision?" Banerjee argues that the writings of Mary Parker Follett, a thinker who is well known in the field of organizational management but routinely ignored in the history of philosophy, deserves a careful rereading in light of this question. Follett is one of the unsung heroes of the American pragmatic tradition; her writings on social psychology and philosophy in Creative Experience (1924) reconceived the concept of the individual as it is typically construed in classical liberalism. Specifically, Follett articulates the way in which personal identity is constituted as a "between relation," through a process of "circular response" between self and other.

The editors of Contemporary Feminist Pragmatism have been careful to select essays that are historically rooted in the classical pragmatist canon, but at the same time take on the issues of contemporary feminism. What is even more notable, however, is their evenhanded treatment of contemporary feminism. They are to be commended for including detailed discussions of both the Continental and the Analytic philosophical traditions, traditions that are often regarded as openly hostile to one another. Susan Dieleman's contribution to the volume stands as a fine example of the way that pragmatism can speak to the concerns of the analytical feminism of Miranda Fricker and Iris Marion Young. In "Solving the Problem of Epistemic Exclusion," Dieleman outlines her project in the following manner:

Contemporary feminist philosophers would do well . . . to explore Richard Rorty's discursive theory of social progress to find the answer to the following question: how can one challenge the norms and practices of knowing that help constitute a community when one is unjustly excluded from invoking those norms or participating in those practices because of who one is, how one speaks, or what one says? (90)

According to Dieleman, Rorty "understands epistemic norms and practices to be contingent and thus capable of being challenged." (101) While it remains unclear, at least from this abridged analysis, how Rorty's "ironic redescription" serves to initiate this challenge, it is a promising thought that deserves more attention.

The contributors to "Part II" concentrate on "Political Practice." Caveat lector: The essays in this section of Contemporary Feminist Pragmatism are explicitly intent on making pragmatism truly practical, that is to say, on giving a motivating description of philosophically informed practice. Philosophers who have retreated to their ivory towers will understand, and therefore downplay, the criticism that these authors issue to their discipline. Judy Whipps, in a very short study, explains how the philosophy of Mary Parker Follett (addressed in Chapter 4), Emily Green Balch, and Vandana Shiva underpinned and motivated their respective political activities in organizational management, humanitarianism, and environmentalism. In the same spirit, Lisa Heldke provides a controversial essay, explaining how Jane Addams's Democracy and Social Ethics helps us analyze women's roles as actors in the political space. Heldke explains the rationale of her project in this way:

If we think -- as I do -- that Addams's conception of patriotism, peace and social ethics have relevance for our own time, and if we believe -- as I do -- that it is fruitful to think about the role that "women's work" can play in advancing these causes, then one question to be considered is, where might we look to find the work of the feminist cosmopolitan patriot being carried out today?

Heldke does not find her answer in the "radical homemaking" of Shannon Hayes, which according to Heldke inhibits the growth of women and their political potentials, but in the intercultural gardening of Germany which explicitly understands the mundane task of gardening as a significant form of cultural integration.

Barbara Thayer-Bacon's contribution attempts to extend her thinking in her Beyond Liberal Democracy in Schools by suggesting that Dewey gives us a way of overcoming liberal democratic theory. In "Education's Role in Democracy," however, Thayer-Bacon never adequately explains what "liberal democracy" is or why it needs to be overcome. She equates liberal democracy with "private interest competition," a definition that suits libertarianism, perhaps, but not contemporary feminist liberalism. (150) Given that so many feminists have engaged liberalism in a meaningful way (Samantha Brennan, Amy Baehr, Carol Hay, Ann Cudd, Martha Nussbaum, Susan Moller, Jean Hampton, Ruth Abbey, and Marilyn Friedman, to name a few) it seems wise for feminist pragmatists not to caricature it too quickly. Liberalism has in recent years taken on the insights of classical pragmatism and may be more amenable to Thayer-Bacon's vision of democracy that is "always-in-the-making." (152) That being said, her on-the-ground approach to social science research and philosophy is in tune with the pragmatic ethos and could further amend liberalism's commitment to ideal theory.

Cynthia Willett's essay ("Visionary Pragmatism and an Ethics of Connectivity") is more nuanced in its treatment of liberalism and opens the volume's final section, "Ethics and Inquiry." Willett is commendable in her charity toward the liberal tradition: "I would not question the liberal tradition of individualism as of significance for contemporary ethics nor would I think that we should question autonomy as one vital dimension of our individuality." Willett, however, in the spirit of Dewey, Cornell West, Toni Morrison, and Patricia Hill Collins, suggests that "emerging social practices . . . cast doubt on autonomy as the pivotal feature of the ethical person." (168)

In the next two contributions, Cathryn Bailey and Maurice Hamington echo Willett's point. Bailey contends that a feminist ethics of care can be supplemented by William James's pragmatism and Mayahana Buddhism and, in so doing can provide a viable alternative to the ethical project that classical liberalism advances. Hamington, similarly, suggests that sympathy and receptivity (ideas developed in detail by Dewey, Addams, and the proto-pragmatist Frances Wright) are vital to moral education. He suggests, I think rightly, that these aspects of moral inquiry are often left out of the story that contemporary liberals want to tell about ethics.

In a contribution that is buried in the back of this rather dense little collection, Claudia Gillberg makes some of the strongest philosophical points of the volume. In "A Methodological Interpretation of Feminist Pragmatism," Gillberg suggests that feminist action research is a way of expanding pragmatism's scope of inquiry, along the lines that Lisa Heldke has set out in her work on John Dewey. For academic philosophers who don't know what action research is (and I was one of them before reading Gillberg's selection), it is a form of experimental method that focuses on the consequences of a researcher's direct actions on a participatory community in order to improve the performance of said community or to ameliorate a problem that its members are experiencing. Gillberg is right in suggesting that early feminist pragmatists such as Jane Addams, Ellen Gates Starr, Ella Flagg Young, and Alice Dewey were all pioneers in this sort of inquiry. What is powerful about her analysis is the way that she anticipates the criticism of those that would claim that such a methodology lacks coherent standards or measurable objectives. This is, not coincidently, a criticism that is often leveled against pragmatism on the whole. In response, Gillberg puts forth a set of validity criteria (229) for feminist action research that might very well serve feminist pragmatism as it gains momentum in the coming years. Additionally, she articulates the goal of feminist action research as combatting the "bureaucratization and simplification" of knowledge claims. (233)

Essays from Heather E. Keith and Erin McKenna close out the volume. In "Natural Caring," Keith effectively argues that Jane Addams's notion of filial piety can be applied beyond the narrow scope of familial relations as they are typically understood. In her words, "a pragmatist feminist social ethics offers a theoretical foundation for care ethics and environmental ethics that goes beyond debates about anthropocentricism." (255) McKenna seems to agree with Keith in important ways. "Charlotte Perkins Gilman: Women, Animals, and Oppression" explains how Gilman's early feminist pragmatism can be used, according to McKenna, to analyze "oppression across species lines -- something many contemporary feminists still fail to do." (240) McKenna has spent her philosophical career arguing that feminism and pragmatism should be natural allies. Her essay, written in this spirit, is therefore an appropriate conclusion to Contemporary Feminist Pragmatism. She writes:

Pragmatism and feminism both require the rejection of dualistic and hierarchical thinking. Specifically, thinking and doing should not be separate, neither should mind and body be ontologically disconnected, nor theory and practice be divided. They also share a focus on concrete problems and the idea that people's lived experiences matter in the formation of knowledge and values. (239)

This is the philosophical vision of Contemporary Feminist Pragmatism. The volume will benefit both specialists and non-specialists, theorists and practitioners, feminists and pragmatists. It will be an invaluable resource in any graduate level seminar on the American pragmatic tradition and only gain traction as pragmatism and feminism become more integrated into mainstream philosophy and the social sciences.

[1] Charlene Haddock Seigfreid (1991) “Where Are All the Pragmatic Feminists.”  Hypatia 6:2, 1.