Contradiction in Motion: Hegel's Organic Conception of Life and Value

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Songsuk Susan Hahn, Contradiction in Motion: Hegel's Organic Conception of Life and Value, Cornell University Press, 2007, 220pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780801444449.

Reviewed by Richard Velkley, Tulane University


Hegel famously declares that "Everything in my logic is indebted to Heraclitus" and "Everything is contradictory." Songsuk Susan Hahn's study is a thoughtful and unusual treatment of contradiction in Hegel. It illuminates crucial links between the logical, aesthetic and ethical aspects of Hegel's system, and furthermore is a welcome departure from the prevailing approach to the dialectic as the public-communal constitution and recognition of rational norms, free of ontological claims, in a kind of historicized Kantianism. Hahn observes that Hegel's concept of life is central to the Science of Logic and to the whole of the system, wherein it has undeniable ontological import. Her book, she tells the reader, began with wonder: "What does Hegel mean when he says we must regard concepts as 'living'?" (195). Through investigating the treatment of life in Hegel's Philosophy of Nature she

located the motivation for his doctrine of contradiction in the peculiar logic governing his model of organic wholes and argued that this logic entailed, not a rejection of the law wholesale, but a synthetic reconstruction of our ordinary understanding of the law in its analytic form. (196)

By thus linking the Philosophy of Nature's account of the self-contradictory character of the living to the fundamental speculative science of the Logic, and thereby to all parts of the system, Hahn seeks to construct an "organic-holistic view of nature and cognition" and to offer a new defense of Hegel's doctrine of contradiction (1). Beyond this her aim is to speak "to the timely need for a radical new way of thinking about conflict, contradiction, and conceptual incommensurability, which will explode many of our assumptions about what should count as knowledge" (198).

The author notes that her study does not closely follow the historical order of Hegel's development, as the young philosopher's earliest stress was on theological, moral and political questions, and she avows her purpose is not to give a strictly historical exegesis but rather "a rational reconstruction of Hegel's organics in a form which I, as a philosopher, would want to defend it" (4-5). Thus she might not be able to claim, on historical grounds, that Hegel's doctrine of contradiction is motivated only by his concept of organism. She may in fact want only to claim that this concept provides the most defensible grounding of the doctrine. In any case she does convincingly argue that both Goethe's reflections on nature and Kant's account of the relation between aesthetics and organism had decisive import for Hegel's views on life and concepts as living. Goethe and Hegel corresponded on nature in Jena, where Schelling also produced a natural philosophy indebted to the philosopher-poet. And beyond the circles of the Naturphilosophen, Kant's legacy included other contemporaries of Hegel (Hamann, Herder, Schiller) developing holistic modes of thought originating largely in aesthetics (12). Hahn's emphasis on the role of philosophizing about life and organic wholes, which brings to the fore an organic-logical-aesthetic nexus in the foundation of Hegel's thought, is a path very usefully taken and seldom trodden.

The book has three parts: I. Hegel's Logic of Organic Wholes; II. Aesthetic Holism and Indiscursivity; III. Organic-Holistic Agency. In Part I Hahn presents a "naturalized" reading of contradiction based on the Logic and Philosophy of Nature, and inquires into "that intersection where he [Hegel] tests his abstract and methodological apparatus against the more concrete, unmanageable aspects of empirical nature" (2). Again this formulation suggests that the logic (the methodological apparatus) has some source(s) other than reflection on life, but it surely is sound to claim that Hegel saw the need to "test" the logic against the structure of the living, and for this Goethe was a leading inspiration. Goethe argued that concepts are not abstract, static and lifeless when the human faculties make the attempt to cognize living entities already existing in nature (10), for it then becomes evident that an "inner intuitive vision of the unity of nature" is required to recognize the coherence of opposing forces in living wholes. He set this call for a more "naturalized" thinking about nature against the dominant, reverse trend of modern thought to place natural phenomena under the rule of pre-given or a priori (especially mathematical) concepts. Nature should not be cognized "as if" alive, but as truly alive, to which end our thought must be more attuned to Becoming. Only fluid concepts can grasp the unity of the living being sustained through the metamorphosis of its parts, which seems to contradict unity. (Thus the perils of understanding through synthesis of wholes out of parts.) Hahn argues that Goethe's program of a deeper empiricism was decisive for Hegel's account of Being and Becoming in the Logic, with its critique of how ordinary Verstand regards these concepts. (In the Lectures on Fine Art Hegel credits Goethe with "insight into the identity between concept and object.") She further claims that it was by thinking through the problem of apprehending the becoming of life that Hegel arrived at his view of "determinate negation," the living sense of negation whereby a being becomes  defined through opposition to others as well as through self-repulsion. Negation thus "naturalized" is not just the formal denial of propositions; it is the ontological character of life as "identity within difference."

Hence starting from the reflection on organism Hegel generalizes to assert that "contradiction is the root of all movement and vitality" (29) and "recasts in the conceptual idiom of dialectical logic" Goethe's account of the movement from Being to Becoming (32). The human spirit, under the law that generates and eliminates contradiction, completes at a conscious level what nature achieved without knowing it (35). But to make this last claim Hegel has to admit a dualist element that was missing in Goethe, for conscious human effort as free is responsible for the highest unity of spirit. Hahn now acknowledges that Hegel's dialectic owes something to the Kantian way of thinking (46-52). In completing her account of the Logic as the dialectic of living concepts, Hahn asserts that Hegel neither affirms nor denies the law of contradiction of classical logic. Formal contradiction as an error to be avoided provides too narrow a basis for grasping ontological contradiction, since self-identity of things implies difference, which is excluded from the analytic judgment of formal logic. Hahn discusses how Hegel differs from both Aristotle and Kant in allowing for actual contradiction in nature, and she has an interesting discussion of Hegel's critique of Kant's grounding of the law of contradiction in terms of analyticity (72-76). The heart of speculative logic is the exposure of the ordinary understanding's inability to fathom "natural contradiction" as something that cannot be rejected as merely false and self-canceling.

Hahn describes in Part II Hegel's conception of art as expressing the first attempt of consciousness to attain a unified nonconceptual grasp of life. Aesthetic experience has an organic character -- judgments of beauty are judgments of organic totality -- and evinces an intuitive kind of knowing mediating between the discursive and the nondiscursive. Hegel adopts Kant's terminology for characterizing life in aesthetic terms. Already in Faith and Knowledge (1802) he sees the epistemological significance of Kant's proposal that the aesthetic ideas of artistic genius involve a mode of cognition akin to the "intuitive intellect" that would apprehend wholes in nondiscursive fashion. Although artistic (pictorial-figurative) "showing" does not achieve the full knowing of Science, it is not merely a form of sense-certainty subject to refutation by implicit propositional content. It manifests "weak knowing" in a self-consciousness of life transcending perception and pointing to fuller expression in morality and ultimately in scientific knowledge. Following Kant, Hegel says the presentation of the "feeling of life" in art  hints at the idea of freedom as the obedience to one's own will without obedience to another (88). In the highest moment of artistic perfection, early Greek religious art, the truth that the divine and the human are one is given a visual form which later achieves linguistic-conceptual expression in the speculative ideas of Science (106). In the treatment of art as a kind of knowing Hegel again shows that philosophic thought rejects simple bivalence and grasps that spirit as organic eludes rigid descriptive oppositions (mere sense vs. knowing).

Hahn's treatment of Hegel's organicism culminates in her discussion of morality in Part III. The logic of organic wholes, embodying contradictory opposites, would seem to remove the possibility of theoretical ethics based on bivalent logic. Indeed Hegel presents ethical conflict as inescapable and as a condition for attaining any ethical knowledge. Accordingly he does not rest ethical judgment solely on discursive reflection about alternatives. Recognition of what is right can come only retrospectively, after living through conflict generated by unreflective devotion to conflicting norms, as classically presented in Greek tragedy. Moral enlightenment is not attained by instruction from some standpoint above the moral actor's own consciousness; it occurs only by learning through suffering ("all action implicates one in evil") in which the negative psychological experiences of guilt and shame are essential moments. Moral conflicts cannot be resolved by appeal to some moral "fact of the matter." In this sense Hegel's ethical thought is action-based, involving a holistic account of the moral agent. The ultimate end of ethical action is the achievement of self-unity in which the agent discovers the unity of outward action and inner intention as something the agent accomplishes and recognizes as his own deed. At the highest level it is the attainment of the synthesis of the impersonality of classical ethical life and the modern Kantian morality of intention, which only historical experience can effectuate. In this result, the intuitive element in "conscience" (the final section in the "Spirit" chapter of the Phenomenology) must be realized and corroborated in a public mode of expression and recognition. Only when the subjective achieves universality in a shared consciousness can mere personal convictions take the form of genuine duties (193). Moral life thus has the organic structure of opposites held in unity through development as a whole -- it is a "local appearance" of the deeper logic of organic self-unity, in this case an appearance that unifies cause and effect, purpose and result, means and end, private and public (180).

Hahn's study makes important contributions through its accounts of how Hegel's thought on life, art and the aesthetic, deeply informs the character and concerns of the logic. I shall append just a few critical remarks. (1) The account of the life/logic relation would benefit from more consideration of the relation of the Logic to the Philosophy of Nature from a systematic standpoint. Hahn is certainly correct to claim that Hegel did not conceive his logic in abstraction from the concrete and empirical, but all the same the Philosophy of Nature is a division of Realphilosophie that follows, in systematic order, the Logic. From that standpoint it is not easy to argue that the logic is the recasting of Goethean Naturphilosophie in the idiom of the dialectic of concepts. (2) A neglected major figure for the themes of her study is Schelling, who similarly was moved by Goethe and Kant's Critique of Judgment in shaping his speculative philosophy and who of course worked closely with Hegel in his Jena period. He gets only two passing mentions (12, 119). But I add that it is a merit of her study that it enables one to appreciate more fully the many affinities linking these two thinkers. (3) Both (1) and (2) can be related to a certain neglect of the Idealist component of Hegel's thought, of the background of Kantian-Fichtean freedom that poses a great challenge to organicism. Hahn cites Hegel's formula that "to be free is to be at home with oneself  (bei sich) in what is the other" (170, n. 19) and she does have some discussion of how spirit as conscious relates to its other in a radical way not found in pre-human organisms. It is essential to the freedom of spirit that its thought and action can appear alien to itself and that this appearance can be overcome, as she notes in her account of morality. One can say that Hegel tries to conceive of freedom as having an organic structure and satisfaction (and here Hahn's discussion is quite helpful) but that his account of its essence could not arise from the reflection on organism alone. Similarly, on the origins of Hegel's logic, one has to say that the impulse to its formulation derives as much from the reflection on the distinctive character of human freedom as from the reflection on organism.