Conversations with Emmanuel Levinas, 1983-1994

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Michaël de Saint Cheron, Conversations with Emmanuel Levinas, 1983-1994, Gary D. Mole (tr.), Duquesne University Press, 2010, 175pp., $18.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780820704289.

Reviewed by Joshua Shaw, Penn State Erie, The Behrend College


Michaël de Saint Cheron's Conversations with Emmanuel Levinas, 1983-1994 (hereafter Conversations), is a somewhat misleadingly titled new publication from Duquesne University Press. The book's title makes it sound as though it is a collection of interviews between Levinas and Saint Cheron, a scholar who has published works on Augustin Malroux and Elie Wiesel and who participated in Levinas's lessons at the École normal israélite orientale from 1983 onward. However, Saint Cheron's interviews compose only a small part of the book, which also contains four essays on Levinas and an extended essay on Yom Kippur, atonement, and forgiveness. The fact that these interviews constitute a small part of the book will be a disappointment for some. However, Conversations has several qualities to recommend it, both as a study of Levinas's philosophy as well as a work of Jewish philosophy in its own right.

Let me get my main criticism of this book out of the way. My main concern has less to do with its content -- with any of Saint Cheron's arguments or interpretive theses about Levinas's philosophy -- and more with how its content is presented. The book's title makes it sound as though it is a collection of interviews, one akin to Jennifer Robbins's Is It Righteous to Be?, with a special focus on interviews conducted in the last decade of Levinas's life. In fact, Saint Cheron's interviews make up only a small part of the book, roughly its first twenty-five pages, starting on page thirteen and ending on page thirty-eight. This will disappoint some readers. It has become a cliché to call attention to the obscurity of Levinas's prose, but the fact remains that his writings are extremely challenging. He was often more direct in interviews, and they have become an invaluable tool for disambiguating claims he makes in works such as Totality and Infinity and Otherwise than Being.

Perhaps more importantly, Levinas allowed himself more latitude in interviews to discuss a wider array of topics. Simon Critchley has described Levinas as a thinker with a single "big idea," the relation to the other, which he returns to time and time again in his philosophic works.[1] This is not to say that his writings are monotonous, but there is a single-mindedness to them, so that we see him reiterating time and time again how the relation to the other cannot be fully comprehended but find relatively little discussion about how his conception of responsibility bears on issues in normative ethics. He allowed himself more freedom in interviews to comment on political events and to speculate about issues in normative ethics. Thus, for example, publications on his views concerning the moral standing of nonhuman nature have come to rely heavily on remarks he makes in interviews, particularly his 1986 interview "The Paradox of Morality," to assess whether his understanding of responsibility is consistent with a robust account of animal rights.

One could argue that the reference to "conversations" in the book's title should be interpreted more figuratively, as referring not only to the interviews in Part One but to the scholarly engagements with Levinas's philosophy in Part Two and to his discussion of Yom Kippur and forgiveness in Part Three, which might be characterized as an homage to Levinas's "Toward the Other." But this justification is unsatisfying. There is relatively little discussion about Levinas in the book's third section, which is by far its longest. Levinas is referenced by my count seven times in this section, which spans approximately forty-eight pages, and is only quoted in passing. His extensive meditation on Yom Kippur, atonement, and forgiveness in "Toward the Other" is mentioned but never receives anything like a thorough, sustained analysis. Instead, Saint Cheron develops his own observations about the distinctive attitudes toward atonement and forgiveness in Jewish thought. Moreover, the reference in the book's title to the years in which he conducted his interviews encourages readers to think that the book will be a collection of them.

Again, this criticism is not directed at the book's content, which, as I explain below, has much to recommend it. Nor do I mean to suggest that the publisher, Duquesne Press, is to blame for misleading readers, for the title is simply a translation of the most recent French work on which it is based (Entretiens avec Emmanuel Levinas, 1983-1994). Nonetheless, I think it's important to emphasize that Conversations is not a collection of interviews, given the significant role they have come to play in English language scholarship on him.

Having presented my main concern, I turn to identifying some of the qualities of the book that make it valuable. It will not be possible to summarize the entirety of its contents, given the variety of topics that are discussed in the interviews, the range of interpretative theses about Levinas's philosophy that Saint Cheron explores in the second section, and the variety of points he makes about Yom Kippur, atonement, and forgiveness in the final section. Instead, I will focus on identifying just a few qualities that distinguish Conversations as a work of Levinas scholarship. I would note in passing, though, that two of the essays in its second section engage in comparative studies that may be of special interest to some scholars -- those interested in Levinas's similarities to Sartre and Malraux. Also, my comments in what follows focus on the book's value as a work of Levinas scholarship, but it should be noted that the final part develops provocative suggestions about the distinctive ways in which forgiveness is treated in Jewish thought and about the challenges Jews face with respect to forgiveness after the Holocaust. Saint Cheron's book may be of interest more generally to scholars working in Jewish philosophy.

Saint Cheron is known in the French academic community for his publications on and interviews with Elie Wiesel. This background is evident in Conversations. To a greater degree than other commentators, Saint Cheron is sensitive to the ways in which Levinas's experience of the Holocaust shaped his philosophy, particularly his experience of survivor-hood. Saint Cheron is not the only commentator to point out how traces of survivor's guilt can be found in Levinas's writings, such as in his repeated insistence that the question raised by death is not, as Hamlet proposed, "To be or not to be?" but "Is it righteous to be?" Levinas here depicts merely existing as something that may be morally culpable, as if by existing we robbed others of their places in the world. Others have suggested that traces of survivor's guilt can be seen in this characterization of death. However, Saint Cheron is especially skilled at establishing this connection between Levinas's philosophy and his experience of the Holocaust and survivor-hood. Consider, for example, how Levinas explains his perspective on death in one of Saint Cheron's interviews:

EL: In the sadness caused by someone's death there's something like the feeling of responsibility for this life that has come to an end and in that sense a feeling similar to guilt, as if we were guilty for surviving, as if there were guilt in innocence . . . when you say death is scandalous, it means that the "survivor" cannot simply and purely wash his hands of the affair. Humanity shares a part of all that's bad in the world. (27)

More than other commentators, then, Saint Cheron is attuned to moments in Levinas's philosophy when he seems to be meditating on his own relationship to the Holocaust in the course of developing his philosophic claims. Let me give another example. Many commentators have noted how Levinas begins Otherwise than Being with a dedication to "those closest among the six million assassinated by the National Socialists," followed by the names, in Hebrew, of those members of his family who were murdered in the Holocaust. Several have suggested that this dedication is telling -- that it reveals something about his philosophic project in Otherwise than Being. Saint Cheron goes farther than others, though, in uncovering links between Levinas's theses in Otherwise than Being and this dedication. He suggests at one point that the "otherwise than being" in the book's title refers to the six million deaths Levinas mentions in his dedication:

The entire philosophy of Otherwise than Being or Beyond Essence begins here [with Levinas's dedication]. How to philosophize out of this gaping hole, this abyss that left Martin Heidegger cold? Does this "otherwise than being" refer in truth to an otherwise than dying, the very dying that is in question in the preliminary epigraph? In other words, what relation can be discerned between these two modalities and dying? (44)

This suggestion, while poignant, could be considered controversial given that there seems to be little textual evidence in Otherwise than Being to suggest Levinas is referring to the Holocaust when he attempts to philosophize about what is "otherwise than being." Instead, it is customary to read him as attempting to show how the relation to the other cannot be analyzed in terms of being or non-being, hence how this relation subverts some of our traditional beliefs about knowledge, language, and time. Yet Saint Cheron skillfully shows how Levinas uses the same terminology when discussing death -- how he repeatedly insists that it is not the opposite or the negation of being, not-being or not-existing, but a "mystery" that cannot be analyzed in ontological terms. On the basis of such remarks, Saint Cheron builds a convincing argument for his interpretation of Otherwise than Being.

Saint Cheron's own interest, then, in the Holocaust and in figures such as Wiesel and Malraux leads him to emphasize certain themes in his essays on Levinas: death, survivor-hood, holiness, the Holocaust and post-Holocaust Jewish life. He is also uniquely attuned to those moments in Levinas's writings when Levinas seems to be concerned to address the great moral crises of the last century, particularly the Holocaust. What emerges in his essays is a more dynamic interpretation of Levinas -- one that approaches his philosophy as an engaged dialogue with history.

His interviews with Levinas are fascinating for similar reasons. As I noted above, Saint Cheron emphasizes the importance of Levinas's ideas about death, survivor-hood, the Holocaust, and holiness in his essays on Levinas. He is also skilled at prompting Levinas to reflect on these issues in his interviews. More generally, he has a gift for encouraging Levinas to apply his ideas to historic events. The translator of Conversations, Gary D. Mole, rightly admits in his foreword that "readers familiar with Levinas may not be treated to any startlingly new revelations" in Saint Cheron's interviews (x). Nonetheless, he is also right in suggesting that these interviews are interesting because one sees Levinas applying his ideas to historic events that were occurring when the interviews were being conducted, and one does encounter some surprising moments in them.

Consider, for example, this question which Saint Cheron poses to Levinas:

Q: Auschwitz, Hiroshima, the Stalinist regime: for you, who witnessed these three central events unfold in our terrible twentieth century, what lesson has been there for your thought? (21)

Levinas refers to these events in several writings and often depicts them as initiating a transformation in our ethical sensibilities. Thus he writes in "Useless Suffering" that "Hitlerism and Stalinism, Hiroshima, the Gulag, and the genocides of Auschwitz and Cambodia" mark an "end to theodicy" and impose an obligation on humanity to deny ourselves any further indifference to "useless suffering."[2] I had expected him to reiterate this point in response to Saint Cheron's question. Yet here is his answer:

E.L.: That secular messianic ideas are no longer possible because people thought that these events announced the end of history. (21)

This reply is unexpected, but it helps to keep in mind the intellectual climate of the early nineties. Saint Cheron's interviews were conducted while the Soviet Union was collapsing, when the reunification of Germany was a recent memory, and when there was much talk in academia about how such events marked "the end of history." Levinas references these discussions several times in Saint Cheron's interviews:

E.L.: What's dramatic is that the end of Communism is the temptation of a time that has lost its orientation. We've become so used to considering time as going somewhere, whether it's waiting for the Messiah, waiting for Christ to return, or the movement toward a just society. Since Marx, this wasn't what Soviet Russia represented for everybody, but for a part of humanity in any case, the collapse of Communism can be felt as the end of history. Which is why what happened in Russia should not be taken lightly. We have suddenly entered a time that's going nowhere. Either it's good or it's bad, since nothing has meaning anymore. (20)

To my knowledge, this is one of the few places where Levinas engages with the debates over the end of history that were popular in the early nineties.

Despite my reservations, then, about this book's title, there is much to recommend Conversations with Emmanuel Levinas, 1983-1994 as a work of Levinas scholarship. Saint Cheron's interviews with Levinas, although brief, have all the qualities that make them such valuable resources: Levinas is considerably clearer in them in presenting his ideas and allows himself more freedom to reflect on the implications of his philosophy for other areas of study. They are also fascinating because of what they reveal about his perspective on the intellectual debates and historic events that took place toward the end of his life. Finally, Saint Cheron's own interest in death, survivor-hood, and holiness, and of how Levinas's experience of Holocaust shaped his thinking on these issues, leads him to develop an interesting approach to Levinas's philosophy. To a greater degree than other commentators, Saint Cheron is concerned to present Levinas's philosophy as emerging in response to the great moral crises of the twentieth century. Finally, although I have not discussed the last part of his book in this review, Saint Cheron's extended meditation on Yom Kippur, atonement, and forgiveness, and on the challenges Jews face in dealing with issues of forgiveness after the Holocaust, has much to recommend it as an independent work of Jewish philosophy in its own right.

[1] See Critchley's Introduction to The Cambridge Companion to Levinas, edited by Simon Critchley and Robert Bernasconi (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2002), 6.

[2] Emmanuel Levinas, "Useless Suffering," Entre Nous: Thinking-of-the-Other, translated by Michael B. Smith and Barbara Harshav (New York: Columbia University Press, 1998), 97.