Corporeal Generosity: On Giving with Nietzsche, Merleau-Ponty, and Levinas

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Diprose, Rosalyn, Corporeal Generosity: On Giving with Nietzsche, Merleau-Ponty, and Levinas, SUNY, 2002, 227pp, $20.95 (pbk), ISBN 0791453219.

Reviewed by Ewa Plonowska Ziarek, University of Notre Dame


In contrast to the influential poststructuralist resuscitation of the notions of gift and welcome, feminist philosophers and writers tend to be rather suspicious that the “virtue” of generosity, even in its postmodern reincarnation, remains in complicity with violence, oppression, and the subordination of women. It is not by accident, for instance, that Virginia Woolf famously portrays a refusal of the violent demand of generosity as the condition of the possibility of women's creativity. As Lily Briscoe, the figure of the feminist painter in To the Lighthouse, observes with anger, “that man, she thought, her anger rising in her, never gave, that man took. She, on the other hand, would be forced to give … . You shan't touch your canvas, he seemed to say, bearing down on her, till you've given what I want of you” (149-150). Presenting its complex arguments with an enviable clarity and eloquence, Diprose's Corporeal Generosity not only shares Woolf's unease but also in fact provides a brilliant diagnosis of the complicity between generosity, domination and gender inequality. Indeed, the main question the book poses pertains to the relations between generosity, power, and social justice. The book rightly criticizes both the traditional philosophical understanding of generosity as a moral virtue and the poststructuralist theories of the gift precisely for their failure to investigate the unequal distributions of the social benefits, labor, costs, and the cultural capital of generosity. One of the effects of such an unequal distribution lies in the extortion of the unacknowledged and devalued “gifts” from disempowered social groups, and in the systematic forgetting of these contributions. As Diprose puts it, “women seem to be incapable of giving anything except that which already belongs to someone else or that which must be extracted by force” (56).

For Diprose, the unequal valuation of the gift in turn implies unequal social valuation of embodiment. By examining how privileged bodies acquire social value through the appropriation of the gifts of others, Diprose argues that the extortion and forgetting of the gift takes place through the social regulation of gender and cultural differences. Diprose's account of what might be called the politics of generosity, its genealogy and normalizing effects, leads her to contest two predominant models of generosity: one based on the contractual exchange of gifts, the other, on moral virtue guided by rational deliberation. For Diprose, these models are intimately interconnected in so far as they both presuppose the possession of private property, the sovereignty of the isolated subject, whose identity is constituted prior to the act of giving, and the contractual exchange in complicity with commodification. This genealogical critique of what we might call “restrictive” contractual economy of generosity is informed by Simone de Beauvoir's analysis of the sacrificial, destructive character of female generosity born out of women's political and economic subordination (Diprose, 85), by Nietzsche's critique of the creditor/debtor relation, and by the post-Foucauldian analysis of disciplinary power. By drawing on the Nietzschean critique of the normalizing, disciplinary function of the creditor/debtor relation presupposed by the contractual character of restrictive generosity, Diprose argues that power not only regulates the circulation of the gift, but also constitutes its value and the identities of its givers/recipients. This kind of genealogical critique of the politics of generosity informs, for instance, the brilliant analysis in the second chapter of the contradictions inherent in the legal, political, and moral regulation of the exchange of body parts-- cells, blood, organs, semen--practiced by modern medicine.

Yet, the critical genealogy of the relation between generosity and power, though crucial for feminist politics, is not the most original contribution of the book to contemporary philosophical discussions of ethics and politics. Although the book is all too aware that the discourse of generosity can support conservative politics, it nonetheless assumes the “fine risk,” in the Levinasian sense of the word, of elaborating an alternative understanding of generosity as the possibility of social justice and transformation. In contrast to the individualistic economy of exchange, this alternative model posits generosity as a pre-reflective, non-volitional openness to the other—an openness that precedes and enables the formation of the subject and social relations. As Diprose puts it, “it is an openness to others that not only precedes and establishes communal relations but constitutes the self as open to otherness. Primordially, generosity is not the expenditure of one's possession but the dispossession of oneself, the being-given to others that undercuts any self-contained ego” (4). As a pre-reflective openness, generosity is fundamentally intertwined with sensibility and corporeality in the sense that it both is registered on the level of affectivity and informs the constitution of the bodily identity. Although this productive, corporeal generosity does not operate outside of normative power, it nonetheless “precedes and exceeds its terms” and, in so doing, opens it to transformation (44).

Diprose's model of corporeal generosity is both indebted to Derrida's account of the aporias of gift and to Levinas's ethical welcome of alterity, and, at the same time, differs from their theories in fundamental ways. What is important for Diprose in Derrida's work is his critique of the reciprocal relations of exchange and his emphasis on the aporetic constitutive function of the gift, which both enables and disrupts the economy of exchange and the formation of identity. The Levinasian inspiration of the whole project is readily apparent in its emphasis on generosity as a pre-reflective ethical openness to alterity. Yet, despite this indebtedness, it is the differences from Derrida and Levinas that foreground the importance and originality of Diprose's theory of generosity. As I have already mentioned, Diprose is far more concerned with the genealogical critique of the politics of generosity, its relation to gender domination, and social justice. Furthermore, her account stresses a fundamental link between generosity, affect, eroticism and corporeality, a link which she develops through her critical engagements with Nietzsche, Foucault, Merleau-Ponty, Beauvoir and Butler. And finally, in fundamental disagreement with Levinas's position, Diprose contests the rigid separation between ethics and ontology. In fact, the ambition of the book is to work out a new ontology of generosity, which would foreground its constitutive role in the emergence of social, embodied subjectivity. Based on the primordial pre-reflective giving of corporeality registered on the level of sensibility, the ontology of the gift becomes the very model of the formation of social identities and differences. It is precisely the absence of such an ontology of intercorporeal giving, Diprose argues, that leads not only to the reductive interpretations of generosity in terms of the contractual model of the exchange of private property—an exchange that is separate from the identity of the subject—but also to the lack of sufficient analysis of social domination, which operates through the commodification of the gift. By contrast, the reinscription of generosity within an ontology of intercorporeality “grounds a passionate subjectivity that aims for a justice that is not here yet” (14). It is precisely this claim that the model of corporeal generosity requires not only a new account of ethics but also of ontology and politics that constitutes the most ambitious and original contribution of the book.

Diprose develops an ontology of corporeal generosity in the first part of the book, primarily through the negotiation between Nietzsche and Merleau-Ponty's philosophies. She begins with Nietzsche's analysis of generosity as both the model of self-production and an alternative to the creditor/debtor relations and mnemotechnics of pain they imply. By focusing on the contradictory role of femininity in the Nietzschean account of the masculine self-production, Diprose stresses the intersubjective and intercorporeal aspects of generosity. By contesting the individualistic undertones of Nietzsche's philosophy, Diprose argues that self-production and self-overcoming are primarily intercorporeal events taking place “through the other's proximity and within a social milieu” (11): Such events rely on “the other's generosity (particularly a woman's giving of herself), a generosity that is denied to the other's detriment” (11).

As a counter to Nietzschean individualism and his ambivalence about indebtedness to the other, Diprose turns to Merleau-Ponty's account of the pre-reflective intertwining of the flesh, in order to develop further a notion of bodily identity that is not individual but fundamentally intersubjective (70). What she reinterprets in terms of generosity is Merleau-Ponty's claim that the becoming of the subject for oneself depends on being with other lived bodies. By functioning as a “mirror,” the other's body gives the incipient subject a model of lived corporeality: “I live my body outside of myself through the mirror space of the other's body” (89). The subject thus becomes aware of its difference through the look and the touch of the other. Because the differentiation of lived corporeality takes place in relation to the other's body, this relational bodily identity is never closed but fundamentally ambiguous, escaping the subject/object distinction. By emphasizing the function of giving in this intersubjective constitution of corporeality, Diprose argues that the ambiguity of bodily existence cannot be interpreted, as sometimes the Lacanian accounts of the mirror stage tend to do, as the alienation of the subject in the other, but as the productive opening of the new possibilities of existence. Ultimately, for Diprose this model of intercorporeal generosity implies a new concept of freedom and its limitation, both of which are based on the capacity—or what Merleau-Ponty calls a “tolerance”—to give and receive corporeality from the other (54-55). Consequently, the projects of bodily becomings are both enabled and limited by what Merleau-Ponty calls the “sedimentation” of the intersubjective exchanges and the institutional settings in which they occur.

This ontology of corporeal generosity allows Diprose both to acknowledge the importance of and to complicate Judith Butler's model of gender performativity. By underscoring the formation of gendered bodies through the regulated repetition of socially prescribed acts, Butler's theory of performativity, Diprose points out, not only accounts for the cultural production of gender norms but also challenges the foundational idea of the subject in the legal and political theories of modernity—namely, the idea of the subject remaining unchanged by her act and thus held accountable for those acts. Nonetheless, despite its seminal importance for feminist philosophy and politics, Butler's work presents for Diprose two limitations: first, it fails to account for the role of the other in the subversion of the gender norms and in so doing becomes vulnerable to charges of individualism; second, it ignores the limits of subversion posed by the corporeal history of the subject, shaped by its sedimented, habitual ways of being in the social world. Diprose proposes a similar critique of Butler's diagnosis of the relation between power and affect: even though her account of gender melancholia is not individualistic, Butler “misses too much … about the dynamics of affective and social life” (97). As Diprose rightly points out, “for the most part, there are only two terms in Butler's account”: the law and the performing body, which in its singularity disrupts its normative identity through the disjunctive repetition (68). By contrast, Diprose stresses the fact that the performative subversion of gender identity occurs not just through the disjunctions inherent in repetition but through the opening to the other's body: “It is because bodies are open onto others, rather than being distinct, that we can act, have an identity, and remain open to change” (69). It is through the ambiguous relation to the body of the other that we can disrupt the sedimented bodily habits and open new modalities of being (72).

Because of the strong emphasis on the intersubjective and the social dynamics of affect, power, and giving, it is hardly surprising that the last part of the book is focused directly on the relation between corporeal generosity and formation of community. Emerging out of lengthy meditation on the political significance of Levinas's ethical responsibility to the other, the main claim here is that generosity born out of corporeal relation to alterity “generates rather than closes off sexual, cultural, and stylistic differences” (13) in social life. Radically opposed to the defensive investments in cultural sameness, Diprose's account of the community formation underscores the ethical and political significance of “a generous response to cultural difference.” Diprose powerfully demonstrates the importance of such a politics in chapter 8, “Truth, Cultural Difference, and Decolonization,” devoted to the analysis of the roles of testimony and apology in the decolonization and reconciliation processes. More specifically, Diprose analyzes the cultural and ethical role of the testimonies about the assimilation policies of European colonialism in Australia that encouraged the removal of indigenous children from their communities. It is in the context of Australian responses to the crimes of cultural genocide that she stages a confrontation between the Nietzschean critique of universal truth, a critique that pinpoints the lie about cultural difference in the project of colonialism, and the Levinasian notion of unconditional apology, which foregrounds the subject's exposure to the accusation of the other. Prompted by historical and political urgency, such a provocative confrontation between Levinas and Nietzsche, and their respective critiques of power/knowledge and generosity, leads to a productive reinterpretation and extension of their thinking that complicates for instance the distinction between ethical alterity and cultural difference.

Ultimately, the book both elaborates and performs a generous modality of philosophical thinking, which creates new concepts and exceeds its own limits by welcoming the disorienting alterity of the other. Seen in this perspective, the project of feminist philosophy for Diprose is not merely the necessary critique of the gender bias in the philosophical tradition and the elaboration of alternative structures of female subjectivity from a feminist point of view but also a transformative critical thinking “through the affective field of the other” (143). In other words, in the context of feminism Diprose performs a difficult shift from a methodology based on the autonomous feminist “standpoint” (from a philosophy “in a different voice,” so to speak) to a philosophy open “to the teaching of the other, including the teaching of feminism” (142).

The only regret I have about this remarkable project is that Diprose does not pursue further the implied critique of the capitalist relations of production and exchange. From her book we get a clear sense of the interventions corporeal generosity can make in the areas of cultural politics, social justice, and philosophical thinking. The questions I was left with were about the capitalist economy and economic injustice: in what sense can corporeal generosity intervene in these social relations? Is the critique of liberalism and the contractual notion of generosity a sufficient response to this problem? These questions notwithstanding, Corporeal Generosity: On Giving with Nietzsche, Merleau-Ponty, and Levinas makes a significant contribution to contemporary discussion of ethics, politics, and embodiment in continental philosophy, feminist theory, and cultural studies. By contesting liberal individualism and the separation between ethics and politics, it offers a powerful discourse of corporeal generosity that preserves utopian aspirations of social justice without being idealist.