Creationism and Its Critics in Antiquity

Placeholder book cover

David Sedley, Creationism and Its Critics in Antiquity, University of California Press, 2007, 269pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780520260061.

Reviewed by J. P. F. Wynne, Northwestern University



Sedley’s Sather Lectures in the Classics, delivered at UC Berkeley in 2004 and published here with scholarly footnotes, offer an important, daring and very refreshing history of the philosophical treatment of ‘creationism’ in the period from Anaxagoras to the early Stoa (with a short appendix on Galen). Along the way Sedley collects a stream of original insights or conjectures philosophical and philological — most readers will rebel against some of these, but all will be grateful for what is, at bottom, a telling of a story that nobody has tried to tell in full before.

Sedley uses ‘creationism’ here to mean “the thesis that the world’s structure and contents can be adequately explained only by postulating at least one intelligent designer, a creator god” (xvii). Creationism (or criticism of it) described in these terms may rest wholly on ‘natural theology’ and have no connection with any divine revelation — in this, the creationism Sedley discusses differs from many creationist positions topical in some parts of the world today.

Each chapter will be fertile reading for specialists in its particular subject who might not have time for the whole book, so I will treat each chapter individually and collect some general remarks at the end. My summaries are not exhaustive; readers will find in every chapter notable claims that I do not have space for here.

Sedley begins with two chapters on the Presocratics in which he sets out to combat a perception that Presocratic science did not appeal to a creative intelligence as later ancient thinkers would. He argues that from Hesiod onwards some divine influence was a background assumption, and thus was not always made explicit, in cosmology. These chapters are complex and far-reaching interpretations of Anaxagoras’ (ch. 1) and Empedocles’ (ch. 2) cosmologies. There is an appendix to ch. 1 on Anaxagoras’ theory of matter and there are four appendices to ch. 2.

Sedley interprets Anaxagoras’ nous or ‘intelligence’ as a farmer who acts on matter (which it did not create) by planning and producing the swirl of the worlds in such a way that the earth and celestial bodies enable the “seeds” distributed through matter (which Sedley interprets as literal biological seeds 15) to grow and, thus, man to flourish (24). Anaxagoras emerges as a materialist and natural scientist more than a theologian, for all his appeal to an intelligence we would call divine (25). Empedocles’ deity Love, on the other hand, is a more hands-on craftsman, a carpenter (52). Yet Love proceeds by allowing complex animals to emerge by something rather like natural selection; Sedley provides an illuminating comparison with convergentist evolutionism to suggest that Love nevertheless plans the outcomes of this process (60-61). Sedley holds that though we live in a part of the world cycle dominated by Love’s sparring-partner, Strife, we still live with the effects of Love’s earlier dominance. For example, though we ordinary humans were produced by Strife’s actions there are still some long-lived and blessed souls who were created by Love — like, Empedocles claims, himself (50).

Ch. 3 on Socrates is startling and the book’s keystone. Sedley argues that the historical Socrates was a radical innovator in seeking explanations of why god’s designs are good and indeed that he produced “the first recorded antecedent of the Argument from Design” (82). In short, he makes Socrates the first full-blown creationist (and removes the same title from Diogenes of Apollonia, 75-78). This may look odd given the strong tradition that Socrates turned philosophy from cosmological speculation to ethics. But Sedley fully agrees with that tradition. He observes, in effect, that there are two sides to creationism — a physical side, based in natural science, and a theological side, based in some theory of god’s nature. Sedley suggests that Socrates came at creationism from the latter angle: Socrates was dissatisfied with Anaxagorean physics (as per the famous ‘autobiography’ in the Phaedo, 98b-d) because Anaxagoras promised to find divine goodness and intelligence reflected in the world but fell back on merely materialist speculation. Sedley’s major text in this chapter is Xenophon’s Memorabilia 1.4 and 4.3, where we find a pious Socrates arguing from design. Scholarly opinion usually plays down Xenophon’s value as a source for the historical Socrates’ philosophy so objectors to Sedley may try to discount this evidence. Whatever we think of the historical Socrates, however, Sedley shows beyond doubt that later in antiquity this passage of Xenophon had a strong influence on the Socratic tradition (on the Stoics, 212-219, and on Galen, 243).

When Plato (ch. 4) produced the Timaeus, Sedley therefore claims, he was not going against his master’s ethical bias but rather squaring up to a challenge laid by Socrates to succeed where Anaxagoras fell short and produce a speculative physics grounded in divine benevolence. Plato himself dramatized the laying this challenge at Phaedo 99c. Further, as Anaxagoras did not, Plato had to meet the anti-creationist challenge of the atomists (22-23). Sedley takes Timaeus’ speech seriously as intended to be an exposition of a physics that seemed most probable to Plato himself. Sedley is also something of a literalist about the speech — he takes Timaeus’ description of the acts of creation not as a conceit to explain the world’s (perhaps eternal) structure but as a claim about real past events. Now, Sedley is aware that to sustain this literalism he must set aside Socrates’ suggestion at Phaedrus 245c5-246a2 that the soul and not matter is the origin of motion, because Timaeus describes primordial matter in motion before the creator’s intervention (104n23 cf. 205n2). This is a legitimate strategy, but it yields the curious result that Plato’s history of creation in the Timaeus would be in conflict with the main argument for theism we find in his corpus, the Athenian Stranger’s argument for soul as the source of motion at Laws 10.891b-899d.

Epicurus, along with his fellow atomists (ch. 5), is the most straightforward critic of creationism in the book. Sedley picks out a key weapon in Epicurus’ armory: the statistical power of infinity. Creationists then and now have argued that complex or apparently purposeful phenomena are vanishingly unlikely to have emerged without design. Epicurus can simply agree but point out that in his infinitely extended universe with its infinite number of atoms vanishingly unlikely things will have happened infinitely often.

For Sedley Aristotle (ch. 6) is decidedly not a creationist since god stands to Aristotle’s teleological cosmos as an object of emulation who nevertheless did not create it and has no part in running it (169-170). Just as Sedley thinks Plato in the Timaeus honored his training with Socrates, he thinks that Aristotle’s removal of god to the limit of the cosmos itself had Platonist motivations. For Sedley, Aristotle did not first and foremost want to minimize divine involvement. Rather, he thought that a really perfect god could not be involved in the messy business of the material world — hence he developed the analogy of Nature as craftsman to illustrate the notion of final causes in nature without divine involvement.

In ch. 7 Sedley assigns the Stoics the role of formalizers. As readers of the arguments of the Timaeus and of Xenophon’s Socrates, they adapt those and similar arguments to their materialist cosmos — Sedley finds a version of Xenophon’s argument in a Stoic passage of Sextus Empiricus, M. 92-103 — and defend them with candid premises and conclusions. Certainly the Stoics should be honored for that, although (as Sedley shows us) they struggled to defend their easily parodied syllogisms. Finishing this chapter, however, one wishes there had been room for a fuller treatment of their other peculiar contributions to creationism — e.g., their appeals to our preconceptions of the divine and wonder at the cosmos, their materialist theology so significantly different in its metaphysics from the Timaeus’ and their interactions with the remarkable natural-scientific revolutions of their period. But such are the constraints of a lecture series.

Now some general comments. First, it is striking that the book is not (only) the history of an idea. It does not just treat each successive thinker’s handling of creationism. Rather, it is a continuous narrative that tries to trace concrete, historical links between philosophers and schools over the centuries — who influenced or responded to whom, even who was reading what. For ancient philosophy this is an adventurous exercise given the nature of the evidence and Sedley must often lean on his formidable skills as a philologist. There are, of course, points where readers may disagree with his judgment. To do so, however, is to join in Sedley’s stimulating and welcome historical project. The point in his story that deserves the most attention — because of its originality and importance, not because it must be wrong — is the key role he gives Socrates in setting a creationist agenda.

Second, as Sedley points out in his preface (xvi) and appendix, readers will inevitably be led to reflect on what light the ancient “argumentative resources” may shed on more recent debates (244). For one thing, it is suggestive to find that in an era where science and theology were so different from our own such recognizable controversies were going on. At the same time the ancients’ quite different assumptions yield possible views that have fallen out of more modern debate. For example, no creationist here has god create ex nihilo — for all of them god is a craftsman who makes the best of his materials — and several in our terms are naturalists, not supernaturalists. As to the ancient critics of creationism, none of them is an atheist in our plainest sense: none of them would say tout court that there is no god.

Plato’s Timaeus calls his theory of creation a “likely story” (Tim. 29d2). The evidence for Sedley’s subject, too, is such that any historical reconstruction will be ‘likely’ at best. But like Timaeus’ theory the book is extremely fresh, insightful and fertile and deserves attention from anyone whose interests relate to it.