Cultural Revolutions: Reason versus Culture in Philosophy, Politics, and Jihad

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Lawrence E. Cahoone, Cultural Revolutions: Reason versus Culture in Philosophy, Politics, and Jihad, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2005, 232 pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0271025247.

Reviewed by Warren Schmaus, Illinois Institute of Technology


The strongest point made by this creatively written book is that the very idea of cultural relativism depends on a questionable notion of culture, according to which a culture is very much like a philosophical system. However, the relationship between these arguments about cultural relativism and much of the rest of the book, including the informative discussion of Islamic revivalism, is not always clear. The book as a whole is uneven in quality and the various parts of it do not all hang together.

In his introduction, Cahoone complains that in most writings on culture, there is no good philosophical definition of this concept. Lacking such a definition, there is no way to tell where one culture ends and the next begins. Although he is sure that nothing we ever do or say transcends our culture, he does not think that this implies cultural relativism. In order to show this, he then seeks to clarify the notion of culture. The first two chapters are devoted to reviewing and critiquing the literature on culture and its relation to liberal political values. He then adopts a more restricted sense of culture than is usually found in the social sciences, defining it as a system of goals or ends. The third chapter then explores the notion of cultural identity and compares it to race, ethnicity, family, and other such notions. In the next couple of chapters, he takes a detour to examine the ideas of modernity and postmodernity. Chapter six returns to a discussion of culture as a system of ends and compares it to play. The seventh chapter contains his key arguments disarming the threat of cultural relativism. In the eighth chapter, Cahoone draws on the history of Islamic movements from the very beginning to argue that recent Islamic revivalism should be understood as a form of modernism rather than as a return to the past. The universalizing tendency of modernism in the Islamic world did not take the form of a turn from tribalism to nationalism, as it did in the West. Instead, it turned to religion. Its refusal to distinguish political from religious authority reflects a desire for logical consistency comparable to that of Enlightenment rationalism. By way of contrast, the Euroamerican West is characterized by hypocrisy. He generalizes this point about Islam in the conclusion, stating that there are in fact many ways to be modern.

In the trenchant seventh chapter, Cahoone argues that the very notion of cultural relativism assumes that a culture constitutes some sort of integrated whole. To think of a belief as culturally determined rather than based on reason and evidence is to presuppose that a culture's beliefs are unified through resting on some subset of fundamental cultural assumptions in the same way that a philosophical system rests on its metaphysical foundations. This kind of systematicity is also supposed to define or provide limits or borders to the culture. Cultural relativism results from raising skeptical questions concerning the warrant for the first principles of one's own culture. However, Cahoone finds Descartes's foundationalism a poor metaphor for how a culture's beliefs relate to each other and the world, preferring something more like a crystal lattice or a network of plants with an interconnected root system. He thinks the burden of proof rests with those who believe that cultures are tightly integrated wholes. For Cahoone, there is no specific philosophical problem of cultural relativism; extending the same line of reasoning to moral as well as cognitive realism, he says that the justification of beliefs and values remains one and the same philosophical problem with or without the notion of culture.

Cahoone also thinks that the notion of a framework that encloses a system of beliefs makes a poor metaphor for a culture. For this author, there are no clear boundaries to a culture and beliefs are not culturally bound. He finds as much variability within cultures as between them. Even within the same culture, people can have completely opposed metaphysical beliefs, and yet share innumerable other beliefs, making communication possible between them. A similar overlap makes intercultural communication possible. He rejects the thesis of the incommensurability of meaning, holding instead that different networks of meaning may refer to the same objects. As he understands it, the Quinean indeterminacy of translation argument does not imply that there are no constraints whatsoever on translation. Furthermore, as others have also pointed out, translation and understanding are not the same thing anyway. As Cahoone argues, it is precisely the bilingual person who is in the best position to point out when a phrase is not translatable. He also points out that cultures have always been in contact with one another, even living side-by-side. Cross-cultural communication, according to Cahoone, is not a philosophical but rather a practical, political problem.

In a somewhat weaker argument, Cahoone also says that relativism cannot make sense of our actual behavior. That is, in the pursuit of any sort of inquiry, whether scientific or common-sense, people act as if contradictory claims to truth are a problem. But that may just be how people act. Perhaps his better argument is that if we were to adopt relativism, we would have to give up "inquiry as we understand it" (171). Instead, he recommends a minimal realism, according to which all truth-claims must be mutually consistent. He believes this realism is necessary, even if he cannot provide a non-circular justification for it. Finally, he reasons that social constructivism is untenable, for if it were true, we would have constructed a much better world for ourselves.

Although this chapter contains some good arguments, there are ways in which it could have been made stronger. His arguments against relativism are addressed to an older literature, including works by Winch, Quine, Gadamer, and Kuhn. There is no recognition of the more recent debates over relativism and constructivism that have arisen in the science studies disciplines or of the attempts by philosophers such as Hacking, Kitcher, and Longino to reconcile the social and cultural with the rational character of scientific knowledge. Also, the relationship of this chapter to much of the rest of the book is not entirely clear. It seems as if the author could have skipped from chapter two directly to chapter seven. Nor is it apparent how this chapter leads into the following chapter on Islamic revivalism, which although interesting in its own right, could just about stand on its own without all that has gone before.

The middle chapters, especially the two about modernism and postmodernism, are the weakest part of the book. Here we find stage theories of historical development and other such sweeping generalizations that philosophy should have left behind long ago. The author also lapses into jargon. Page after page goes by where it is not clear what he means or how to tell whether what he says is true. The claims he makes about history and society are essentially empirical claims for which he offers little supporting evidence. For instance, he claims that the distinction between the truth of a speech act and its social legitimacy is very recent and did not exist for pre-modern society, asserts that there was no sphere of public discourse in the middle ages, and descries a trend in which the local public realm matters less and less. Often his claims contain such ill-defined terms that it is not clear what evidence would count for or against them, as when he detects a trend towards the "obsolescence" of culture, or at least what is left of the culture once we subtract the mass media (93). At first he says that this does not mean that it is being colonized by mass culture or that it is shrinking, but then on the following page he seems to suggest that it is a matter of colonization after all. One is left wondering just what the obsolescence of culture could possibly mean. Perhaps it appears to be becoming obsolete to the author only because he had adopted earlier a very restricted idea of culture, which, although it includes more than language, does not include, for instance, higher mathematics and screwdrivers -- for reasons that are not entirely clear.

In some of the other surprising claims that he makes in these middle chapters, it is simply not clear who he is talking about, as for example when he affirms that today, unlike in the eighteenth century, nobody values culture except as something to be consumed. It is notoriously difficult to measure attitudes even among living populations, let alone those of centuries ago, and it is not at all clear what populations he has in mind. As a case in point, he believes that school children today learn that culture does not matter: that it is all the same whether one reads Shakespeare or watches sitcoms. But of course one hundred years ago most children never went beyond elementary school, and one hundred years before that fewer still got even that far. Similarly, he claims that the Aristotelian and Newtonian ontologies could be socially assimilated, while the ontology of twentieth-century physics could not, even among the educated. But one wonders what part of the population in the past was able to assimilate even these older ontologies. One could argue that there are Newtonian and Galilean concepts, such as inertia and the composition of motions, that are still not generally understood even today, and that the common-sense worldview is closer to medieval impetus theory. Finally, he maintains that the postmodern era reflects a return to culture, authority, and society, and away from the modern concern with reason, experience, and nature. Again, just who is he talking about? The common man? The educated elite? Just the humanists and social scientists? After all, something like a million scientific papers are published every year, and one can hardly detect in them a turning away from reason, experience, and nature.

At some point, hypotheses in social theory must be submitted to empirical control. It seems that Cahoone's justificatory strategy is instead to persuade reader's that his speculations cohere with their general impressions of society, culture, and history, or with similar speculations produced by other social theorists. But why should we regard our impressions as trustworthy? And the effect of citing other social theorists is often that of an appeal to authority, especially when he refers to some theorist by name but without providing a precise citation.

Problems of evidence and clarity also mar his discussion in chapter three of culture, race, and ethnicity. His definition of ethnicity, which stipulates that it must be relevant to some sort of problematic social situation, would leave many Americans with no ethnicity at all, including the author, who identifies himself as Scottish-American. When arguing that being familiar with and able to operate within a culture is different from sharing a cultural identity, he cites as his example the Japanese, an insular people in more than one sense of the term. Even many Europeans, not to speak of Americans or Canadians, are more willing to accept someone into their culture. Astonishingly, he asserts that it is because the Native Americans were hunter-gatherers that they were incompatible with agricultural Europeans, apparently ignoring the traditional stories about Native Americans teaching the early English settlers how to plant corn. Another startling claim is that in feudal times, "life and political authority remained local while language and hence folk culture held over a region" (69). Cahoone appears to be reading the present into the past, assuming a regional uniformity of language that dates only from the time of Gutenberg and Luther. Even today, there are neighboring villages in rural China that are linguistically distinct.

Curiously, it is the weakest chapters of the book that the author draws on in the conclusion, where he turns once again to stage theories and sweeping generalizations, rather than to his incisive arguments about the definition of culture and the problem of cultural relativism. The main contribution of this book is his critique of the idea of culture in order to show why culture relativism is incoherent. The discussion of Islamic revivalism is also useful and well written. Like the discussion of cultural relativism, it is clear enough that one could assign it even to undergraduates. Each of these two discussions could be -- and perhaps should have been - separated from the rest.