Custom and Reason in Hume: A Kantian Reading of the First Book of the Treatise

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Henry E. Allison, Custom and Reason in Hume: A Kantian Reading of the First Book of the Treatise, Oxford University Press, 2008, 412pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199532889.

Reviewed by Karl Schafer, University of Pittsburgh


Few historical figures have as many contemporary philosophical proponents as do Hume and Kant. Contemporary Humeans and Kantians can be found in the philosophy of mind, metaphysics, epistemology, metaethics, and normative ethics proper. And in many of these cases, it is possible to see central elements of the contemporary debate as an extension of differences in opinion between Hume and Kant themselves.

Given this, we should all be interested in the relationship between these two philosophers' thought. So it is not surprising that there is a growing body of work dedicated to the consideration of the philosophy of one of them in light of the philosophy of the other.

Little of this work, though, has the scope, depth, and systematic rigor of Henry Allison's new book, Custom and Reason in Hume. Although Allison makes no secret that his ultimate sympathies in these debates lie with Kant, his treatment of Hume is careful, sophisticated, and sympathetic throughout. Allison never reduces Hume to a straw man ripe for Kantian abuse -- rather he carefully uncovers the internal logic that moves Hume from his basic philosophical assumptions to his ultimate conclusions. And Allison is quick to stress the similarities as well as the differences between Hume and Kant on many issues, thereby avoiding the simple oppositions between Humeanism and Kantianism that are all too familiar.

Allison's discussion covers far too many issues for me to do justice here to more than a fraction of them, so I will limit myself to some brief comments on Allison's treatment of three central issues: (i) Hume's and Kant's accounts of cognition, (ii) the relationship between Hume's cognitive psychology and his normative epistemology, and (iii) the relationship between philosophy and common sense in Hume and Kant.

1. Hume and Kant on Cognition

As Allison stresses, one of the most fundamental disagreements between Hume and Kant focuses on the nature of cognition in general, and of the role of concepts in cognition in particular.

According to Allison, Hume's model of cognition is an instance of what Allison calls the "perceptual model".[1] It deserves this name, Allison writes, "because it regards the paradigm of cognition as the immediate apprehension of a particular content that is before the mind, that is, as a kind of seeing with 'the mind's eye'." (6)

This model of cognition, according to Allison, may be found in a variety of philosophers -- including Descartes and Locke as well as Hume. In Allison's view, what makes Hume's version of the perceptual model distinctive is the extreme imagistic form it takes. According to Allison, because Hume endorses the perceptual model and because he thinks of the ideas we perceive as "pale copies" or images of our impressions, he is forced to regard cognition as nothing beyond a process of "apprehending and relating images" of various sorts. (7-8)

Such a model of cognition is, of course, quite different from the model of cognition we find in Kant, according to which cognition arises through the interaction between two distinct elements: (i) sensibility and (ii) the discursive, concept-applying activity of the understanding. This difference, according to Allison, is the fundamental flaw in Hume's philosophy of mind. For, Allison argues, the perceptual model -- particularly in its imagistic form -- is unable to do justice to the role that discursive concepts play in generating cognition.

I agree that one of the most fundamental differences between Hume and Kant lies in the different accounts they give of the role of concepts in thought. But it seems to me that Allison overstates the degree to which an imagistic, perceptual model dominates Hume's account of cognition. And, as a result, it seems to me that Allison understates the similarities between Hume's and Kant's theories of cognition.

In particular, while it is true that Hume's account of cognition begins with an account of how we perceive ideas thought of as images or copies of impressions, it is by no means limited to such an account. This is particularly clear in Hume's discussion of the nature of abstract or general ideas. As is familiar, Hume explains how a particular idea may function as a general idea by appealing to the manner in which this idea may be associated with other particular ideas. So, for example, the idea I have now of a particular white coffee cup can, according to Hume, function as an idea of coffee cups in general by being associated (in a particular manner) with all my other ideas of particular coffee cups.

Of course, Allison is well aware of Hume's account of these issues.[2] But the crucial point here is that in giving such an account, Hume moves decisively beyond anything that might be properly termed a purely perceptual model of cognition. A Humean general idea represents the general class of things it does, not (solely) in virtue of the content one immediately perceives in having it "before the mind", but rather in virtue of the manner in which it is associated with other ideas. Thus, in Hume's account of general ideas, we can see that the cognitive significance of an idea is, for Hume, a matter of at least two features of the idea: (i) the image it "presents" to the mind and (ii) the functional role it plays in the mind of the thinker.

Thus, for Hume, human cognition arises through the interaction of two elements: (i) the manner in which we perceive particular ideas or images and (ii) the manner in which we associate these images with another in accordance with general associative habits. Given this, what distinguishes Hume's account of cognition from Kant's is not that Hume believes that cognition can be reduced to the mere perception of ideas -- for, in fact, both Hume and Kant think of cognition as arising from the interaction of two distinct elements, one of which goes beyond anything purely perceptual. Rather, the difference between Hume and Kant on these issues is a matter of how they think of the second of these elements -- and, in particular, how they think of the sorts of habits or rules that are involved in general ideas or concepts.

2. Cognitive Psychology and Normative Epistemology

Nonetheless, these comments are very much in keeping with Allison's general understanding of the relationship between Hume and Kant on the nature of cognition. After all, just as Allison claims, the main difference between Kant's understanding of concepts and Hume's understanding of general ideas lies in Kant's insistence that the rules involved in concepts must be understood, not simply in terms of patterns of association, but instead in terms of logical relations between concepts and judgments.

This brings us to the second major issue I want to discuss: the relationship between Hume's cognitive psychology and his normative epistemology. To consider this issue, it will be helpful to focus on a particular instance of it -- namely, Hume's discussion of causal inference. Here Allison, drawing on recent work by Don Garrett and David Owen, interprets Hume's famous discussion of whether the mind is "determin'd by reason" to infer causes from effects to be primarily concerned with the cognitive psychology of causal inference. Thus, as Allison reads him, Hume's main point in these famous arguments is that our propensity to make such inferences is based, not on any further piece of reasoning, but rather on certain associative habits of our minds.

In my view, Allison is correct to read Hume's arguments in this way. But, as Allison himself stresses, reading these arguments as primarily concerned with cognitive psychology does not mean that they do not have further epistemological consequences. Thus, the real question here is what these consequences are.

One traditional reading of Hume takes the main consequence of these arguments to be a radical skepticism about all causal reasoning. But Allison, quite rightly to my mind, rejects this interpretation of Hume -- insisting that Hume's aim in Book I of the Treatise is not to overturn the epistemic status of ordinary causal reasoning, but instead to force us to rethink what the epistemic status of such reasoning consists in.[3]

How would Hume's arguments concerning causal inference have this effect? Allison believes that these arguments commit Hume to a form of the Sellarsian "myth of the given". In particular, he argues, if we accept that our tendency to make causal inferences is based, not on further reasoning, but simply on a particular habit of our mind -- and accept that such inferences are justified -- we must accept that a pattern of inference can be justified, even though it is not justified by any further piece of reasoning.

Whether or not this is truly a form of the Sellarsian "myth" seems to me open to question, since what is at issue here is the status of a pattern of inference as opposed to the status of some set of "given" propositions. But nonetheless Allison's basic point seems to me correct. Given Hume's account of causal inference, we cannot think of the positive epistemic status of such inferences in terms of the fact that they rest on some further justifying argument. And so, if we are to avoid skepticism, we must understand their epistemic status in some other way.

How, according to Hume, should we think of the status of these inferences? As Allison points out, part of Hume's answer to this question lies in what has come to be called the Title Principle, which states that we ought to assent to reason only when it is "lively, and mixes itself with some propensity". But while the Title Principle does tell us when we should and shouldn't assent to some piece of reasoning, it does not tell us why we should accept this standard. So it cannot be the whole story.

Building upon Christine Korsgaard's work, Allison argues that Hume's answer to this further question involves the application of a test of reflective endorsement. In particular, Allison argues that Hume believes we should accept reasoning that meets the Title Principle test because reason (once limited by the Title Principle) approves of itself. So, according to Allison, we should accept the Title Principle because it provides us with a way of limiting the scope of theoretical reason so that, even in the face of Hume's skeptical arguments, it can achieve this sort of reflective self-approval.

In considering this issue, Allison is entirely correct to focus on whether reason (as limited by the Title Principle) survives a certain sort of reflection. But both Allison and Korsgaard seem to me mistaken in focusing primarily on whether reason (when so limited) can gain its own reflective approval. Rather, what is crucial for Hume at the close of Book I is whether reason (when so limited) can secure, not its own approval, but rather the approval of the passions which move Hume to return to philosophy from his skeptical melancholy -- namely, ambition and (most importantly) curiosity or a "love of truth". In other words, the normative standing of the Title Principle ultimately rests on its ability to secure the approval of the passions that guide Hume in his philosophical investigations.

Thinking of the justification of the Title Principle in this way has a number of advantages. For instance, it makes it easy to understand the central role that Hume's passionate responses to his earlier discoveries play in the conclusion to Book I. After all, on this account, it is the reflective approval of certain epistemically-relevant passions that will determine the normative implications of these discoveries.

Moreover, thinking of the sort of reflective endorsement at work in Book I in this way allows us to see Hume's account of good reasoning -- or, in other words, his account of epistemic virtue -- as a natural extension of his account of moral virtue. On this account, just as a character trait counts as a Humean moral virtue insofar as it is able to gain the reflective approval of the morally-relevant passions from a general point of view, a particular way of reasoning will count as a Humean epistemic virtue just in case it is able to gain the reflective approval of the epistemically-relevant passions (such as curiosity) from a similar point of view.

3. Philosophy and Common Sense

In closing, I want to briefly discuss one further issue: Hume's and Kant's understanding of the relationship between common sense and philosophy. To a large degree, Hume conceives of both his theoretical and his moral philosophy as vindications of the pre-theoretical point of view of the common man. And Kant clearly thinks of his moral philosophy in very similar terms. What is less obvious is whether Kant would say the same about his theoretical philosophy. For, as Allison claims, it can seem that, "Kant would hardly wish to suggest an affinity between the true philosophy (transcendental idealism) and the views of the vulgar or, as he would put it, ordinary human understanding." (280)

If this is right, it indicates a basic difference between Hume's and Kant's understanding of the relationship between theoretical philosophy and common sense. But it seems to me that Allison here overstates the differences between Hume and Kant on this issue. For example, consider the following, rather remarkable quote from the final section of the Groundwork:

No subtle reflection is required to make the following remark, and one may assume that the commonest understanding can make it, though in its own way, by an obscure discrimination of judgment which it calls feeling: that all representations which come to us involuntarily (as do those of the senses) enable us to cognize objects only as they affect us and we remain ignorant of what they may be in themselves so that, as regards representations of this kind … we can achieve only cognition of appearances, never of things-in-themselves. (4:451)

Here Kant claims that the truth of transcendental idealism is part of the ordinary man's understanding of things -- although, of course, the common man has at best a very vague understanding of this truth. If this is right, then both Kant's theoretical philosophy and his practical philosophy are best understood as attempts to make systematic sense of ideas that are themselves deeply rooted in ordinary human understanding. And so it seems to me that in the theoretical sphere (as well as in the moral) Kant is even closer to Hume than Allison suggests he is.


In these comments, I have tried to indicate several points at which Allison's interpretation of Hume -- and of Hume's relationship to Kant -- might be improved upon. But this should do nothing to obscure the very broad and deep sympathy I feel with Allison's discussion of these issues. On the great majority of the most fundamental points, Allison's reading of Hume seems to me precisely right. And whether or not one agrees with its details, Allison's discussion of Hume is philosophically deep and thought-provoking throughout. This is a book every philosopher interested in the relationship between these two philosophers should read, and read carefully.

[1] Here Allison draws on recent published and unpublished work by Graciela De Pierris.

[2] Allison, like many commentators, rejects Hume's account of general ideas as viciously circular. I believe that the objections he raises can be answered, but there is no space to enter into this issue here.

[3] I will use the somewhat awkward phrase "positive epistemic status" so as to remain mute on the vexed issue of how exactly Hume conceives of the "goodness" of an epistemically good inference.