Darwin, God, and the Meaning of Life: How Evolutionary Theory Undermines Everything You Thought You Knew

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Steve Stewart-Williams, Darwin, God, and the Meaning of Life: How Evolutionary Theory Undermines Everything You Thought You Knew, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 341pp., $28.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521762786.

Reviewed by Guy Kahane, University of Oxford


This is a book about the implications of evolutionary theory for some grand old questions about the existence of God, our understanding of the place of humankind in nature, and morality. The author, Steve Stewart-Williams, is an evolutionary psychologist, and, as the bombastic title and even more bombastic subtitle suggest, the book is aimed at a popular audience, not at philosophers -- it would slot nicely into the New Atheist bookshelf. Yet the book is not, as one might expect, full of colourful scientific examples or witty anecdotes. It proceeds like a philosophy book, by setting out a range of positions for consideration and then assessing arguments for and against them. Scientific evidence is brought in when necessary, but it's presented from a great distance, and the discussion remains fairly abstract throughout the book. This book is certainly not an introduction to the most exciting recent scientific advances. And if you wondered (or worried), there is virtually no evolutionary psychology.

The main themes are briefly introduced in the first chapter. The rest of the book is divided into three parts. The first part, which covers more familiar ground, is about evolution and God. Chapter 2 offers a brief introduction to Darwin and evolutionary theory, and explains the main evidence for the theory of evolution. Its main point is that the mere fact of evolution is incompatible with a literal reading of Genesis and with other forms of creationism. Stewart-Williams then examines and dismisses Michael Behe's arguments for Intelligent Design. He next turns, in chapter 3, to show how evolutionary theory undermines the traditional argument from design. Darwin was worried about how the general public would receive his theory, but many religious believers believe that Darwin's theory is perfectly compatible with theism. Chapter 4 argues against such reconciliation.

According to theistic evolution, the creation story in Genesis shouldn't be taken literally. Evolution did occur, but it is actively guided by God. As Stewart-Williams puts it, this view accepts the fact of evolution but not the theory of evolution. Stewart-Williams thinks that theistic evolution is made extremely implausible by the extensive record of arbitrariness and imperfection in nature. A more modest form of reconciliation is broadly deist, seeing natural selection as God's way of creating life by proxy, without continuous intervention. Chapter 5 criticizes deism and other ways in which God is invoked as a 'gap filler', to explain, for example, how life arose from inanimate matter, or why the universe seems 'fine-tuned' to allow for life; Stewart-Williams offers a brief summary of naturalist answers to these worries. He then turns to address other worries about the limits of evolutionary explanation relating to the emergence of human intelligence and consciousness. He remarks that because from an evolutionary perspective mind is itself an adaptation -- an example of order in nature -- it is implausible to appeal to it to explain nature and its order.

Chapter 6 introduces the problem of evil, as it is amplified by evolutionary theory. The Darwinian problem of evil, as Stewart-Williams calls it, highlights the immense amount of animal suffering that has taken place during the millions of years of evolution. This immense and seemingly pointless suffering makes it puzzling why an omnibenevolent God would create humans and other animals through such an agonizing process rather than directly, as creationists believe. Stewart-Williams admits that God's existence might be logically compatible with this vast suffering but, as you'll expect, thinks this evil makes God's existence extremely improbable. Indeed, evolution offers good explanations both for the capacity of sentient beings to suffer and for why good people sometimes suffer greatly. This chapter also includes a brief and rather unsatisfying discussion of free will.

Chapter 7 briefly considers alternative conceptions of God which may seem immune to the arguments of previous chapters. Just as evolution pressures believers to adopt a non-literal reading of the Bible, the Darwinian problem of evil can push them towards non-traditional conceptions of God. But Stewart-Williams thinks that such conceptions of God, which deny, for example, that God is literally a person or has causal powers, are too vague and abstract. To Stewart-Williams their whole point is to make religious belief unfalsifiable and immune to rational assessment. But he is doubtful whether such revisionary conceptions can really replace the traditional understanding of God -- whether, for example, it would still make sense to worship God, understood in this way. And when taken too far, it is doubtful whether it is still appropriate or useful to use the word 'God' in ways that depart so radically from its original sense. Indeed, such a use would implausibly imply that the vast majority of religious believers in fact do not believe that God exists. This popular book is often more philosophically sophisticated than one might expect, but there are some slips: writing of non-cognitivist accounts of religious language, Stewart-Williams says that he suspects that "most believers would be surprised to learn that God is not a propositional belief!" (132), a sentence that deserves a further exclamation mark.

This, then, is Stewart-Williams's survey of possible theist responses to evolutionary theory: Creationists maintain belief in the traditional God but implausibly reject both the fact and the theory of evolution. Theist evolutionists hold on to such belief, but at least accept the fact of evolution; this view, however, is made implausible by the scientific evidence. Deist evolutionists go further and fully accept the theory of evolution, but in order to do so they must give up much of the traditional understanding of God, and still face the Darwinian problem of evil. To go even beyond that is to adopt a radically revisionary and non-anthropomorphic conception of God which, for Stewart-Williams, is either obscure or amounts to a form of atheism -- the response to evolutionary theory that he of course favours.

Part II is about 'life after Darwin'. Chapter 8 considers our place in the universe. Humans see themselves as special and distinct from the rest of nature. But Stewart-Williams thinks that evolutionary theory blurs or even erases many distinctions that are needed if humans are to have that exalted status. He takes evolutionary theory to cast doubt on the division between mind and matter and between humans and animals. It places us firmly in the natural world and stresses our kinship with other animals. And if the mind is just the product of an evolved brain, this also means that the religious idea of the afterlife is implausible.

This theme is further developed in chapter 9. Humans have traditionally seen themselves as the centrepiece of creation, or as the superior endpoint of the great chain of being. But evolutionary theory exposes us as merely one species among millions. Stewart-Williams argues that this idea cannot be updated by thinking of evolution as a process aiming at progress. Evolution involves change, not progress or change that is necessarily good. And by purely biological criteria, it could be argued that beetles (or perhaps bacteria) are vastly more successful compared to humans. Stewart-Williams denies that evolution is associated with any large-scale trend toward greater complexity. In any case, he wonders why we should think that complexity is better than simplicity (which we see as superior, for example, when choosing between competing scientific theories). As he puts it, "it all depends on what we choose to value." He thinks that there are "no objective grounds to say that this is a good thing. If you like it, it's a good thing. If you don't, it's not. There is nothing else to say about it." (177)

Stewart-Williams thinks that the same applies to the human capacity for language, or for reason. Even if humans have these capacities in a way that is not entirely continuous with other animals (including our extinct predecessors), this still won't show that we're above the animals. Reason is merely an adaptation, just one way that we differ from animals, as they differ from each other. So we could not be said to be superior in any 'global sense'. Again, the idea is that the standards we adopt to compare ourselves to other animals are arbitrary, and on some possible standards we'd be vastly inferior to most or even all animals. Stewart-Williams writes that "if we wish to argue that our choice [of standard] is based on more than just an anthropocentric bias, we must show that it has some objective justification. The problem is that, in a Darwinian universe, this is not possible even in principle." (185) This is not the best argument. It's true, and worth pointing out, that such talk about superiority often amounts to a value claim that cannot be simply derived from the science. But it's misleading, or worse, for him to assert that it's in principle impossible for such a value claim to be true in a Darwinian universe. As we shall see below, Stewart-Williams does later argue that no objective value claim is true. But he is also perfectly happy to make straight value claims when it suits him, and it's not at all clear that anything he says should prevent us from endorsing the claim that reason, and those who possess it, are valuable in a distinctive way.

Chapter 10 is about the meaning of life. It is rather brief and disappointing. Evolutionary theory is supposed to show that our existence is meaningless and has no purpose. As Stewart-Williams puts it, "We are here because we evolved, and evolution occurred for no particular purpose." (197) But (surprise, surprise) this does not mean we cannot form our own purposes and thus endow our lives with meaning. The possibility that the 'meaning of life' might refer to something other than a divine plan or cosmic purpose is not considered.

Part III is about 'morality stripped of superstition'. Chapter 11 discusses the evolutionary origins of morality, focusing on the problem of explaining altruism in evolutionary terms. As elsewhere in the book, some of the classic work is surveyed in a clear and accessible way, but more recent developments are largely ignored. Somewhat surprisingly, Stewart-Williams insists that although our basic moral dispositions and sentiments have an evolutionary origins, the concrete content of our moral beliefs is actually largely due to societal influence, and can transcend their biological starting point.

Chapter 12 is a nice discussion of common mistakes about the ethical implications of evolutionary theory. Stewart-Williams does a good job of introducing Hume's point about the gap between 'is' and 'ought', and, unusually for this kind of book, actually gets the actual meaning of Moore's 'naturalistic fallacy' right. Stewart-Williams then does a good job showing why evolutionary theory doesn't support Social Darwinism or justify the status quo, and why it's silly to present it as the basis of Nazism or as inevitably leading to eugenics. He also criticizes some misconceptions about the normative implications of evolutionary psychology but, surprisingly, doesn't actually spend much time defending its scientific credentials against familiar criticism. Readers of the book might fail to see that one can accept evolutionary theory in full without accepting many of the claims of evolutionary psychologists.

In chapter 13, Stewart-Williams then turns to what he takes to be the real ethical implications of evolutionary theory. These turn out to be rather disappointing: apparently evolution helps to undermine the doctrine of human dignity (this chapter draws heavily on Rachels and Singer). The idea is that evolutionary theory undermines the idea that we have special dignity because we were created in the image of God or because we possess reason. Setting aside the former, Stewart-Williams's arguments against appealing to reason to ground a superior moral status to humans are just the largely irrelevant point that our cognitive capacities are broadly continuous with those of other animals, and the problematic earlier claim that there are no good grounds for taking reason to be more important than any other adaptation. There is certainly reason to be suspicious of many uses of the rather obscure notion of 'human dignity', but this has less to do with evolution than Stewart-Williams thinks.

The normative upshot of rejecting human dignity is supposed to be that suicide and voluntary euthanasia are not as wrong as they are taken to be by traditional morality and many religious believers -- conclusions that would hardly be shocking to the educated reader and which, again, can be given strong enough support without mention of evolution. The chapter ends with a spirited argument for treating animals better (the familiar comparisons with racism are inevitably drawn). Stewart-Williams's discussion of moral status is not sophisticated and is ultimately based on the assertion that "Suffering is suffering, and . . . other variables are morally irrelevant." (275). It would have been nicer if Stewart-Williams had been a bit more explicit about the dramatic implications of taking the suffering of all sentient beings on the planet to matter just as much as human suffering. There is only a brief defensive gesture at the supposed greater capacity for suffering that humans have compared to other animals. But in a book such as this, one expects such a claim to be supported by some hard data.

After these claims, it should not be very surprising that the book ends with the suggestion that evolutionary theory supports hedonic utilitarianism. What is somewhat more surprising is that the final chapter tells us that evolutionary theory supports both utilitarianism and nihilism. The argument for moral nihilism is essentially a very condensed version of Richard Joyce's defense of the error theory (Michael Ruse also gets credit). While Stewart-Williams's summary of this argument is pretty good, it is no more than a summary, and as a discussion of the metaethical options left open by a naturalist Darwinian view, this chapter leaves much to be desired (non-cognitivism is mentioned briefly, non-naturalism is caricaturized, and response-dependent and realist naturalist views are not even mentioned). Stewart-Williams also forgets that he had earlier denied that the substance of our moral views can be fully explained in evolutionary terms, a claim that is potentially in tension with his endorsement of the Ruse/Joyce argument. And Stewart-Williams assumes that if we accept the error theory, then it simply follows that we must become moral subjectivists of the most primitive kind and that our ultimate moral views are merely a matter of taste.

The defence of utilitarianism is left to the last hasty few pages of the book. Stewart-Williams thinks that utilitarianism is supported by the point that moral intuitions opposing it may have been selected by evolution (again his earlier suggestion that social influences play a key role in shaping our moral views is ignored). This bit of the argument is rather confused, since that is of course also true of any concern we have for others' suffering. But in the end Stewart-Williams's argument for utilitarianism is simply that he cares about suffering and about nothing else. As he puts it, this "just happens to be to my taste and perhaps to yours as well." He strangely ignores the obvious relativist implications of such remarks.

While I can see why moral nihilism and hedonic utilitarianism have been left to the very end, this way of arranging things is rather odd and, coming after several chapters of substantive ethical argument, may well confuse some readers. If someone happens to care about things other than suffering then she could easily resist some of Stewart-Williams's earlier ethical conclusions, and, as he admits, her view would be just as rationally defensible as his. That Stewart-Williams happens to care only about suffering is not an implication of evolutionary theory.

I found Stewart-Williams's book most interesting as a lucid statement of a kind of 'commonsense naturalism' -- the set of metaphysical, methaethical and ethical views that seem to be attractive to educated and sophisticated atheists. These appear to include the claims that free will is an illusion, life is meaningless, morality is a myth and ultimately based on our subjective attitudes, and that the only thing that morally matters is suffering (and presumably pleasure). While not an incoherent set of views, and while I can see how it can be an attractive package to a certain kind of person, it is in some ways a peculiar list. In particular, as Bernard Williams pointed out, it is actually fairly easy to reject utilitarianism if one takes morality to be ultimately based on nothing more than our subjective commitments. Stewart-Williams is careful enough to distinguish a range of theist views in the first part of the book and tries to assess how each is affected by the truth of evolutionary theory. It is unfortunate that in the rest of the book he presents such a narrow picture of the ethical views that are left on the table once we accept evolutionary theory, given that evolutionary theory -- or rather, naturalism -- is perfectly compatible with a far broader range of metaethical and normative options.

This book is clearly written and vigorously argued. It covers a lot of ground, but it is not philosophically deep or especially original. The arguments against God's existence in its first part are unlikely to impress theists philosophers, who will (perhaps rightly) feel that Stewart-Williams simply ignores the most important theist moves and arguments of recent decades. The discussion of morality, while lucid, is largely derived from Ruse, Joyce, Rachels and Singer -- authors that are already rather accessible. This book would be fine for an introductory undergraduate course. The discussion is a bit more focused and systematic than recent New Atheist books, but if I had to choose an introductory book for an undergraduate course, I'd probably prefer Dawkins and Dennett.