Das Problem der Willensschwäche in der mittelalterlichen Philosophie / The Problem of Weakness of Will in Medieval Philosophy

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Tobias Hoffmann, Jörn Müller, and Matthias Perkams (eds.), Das Problem der Willensschwäche in der mittelalterlichen Philosophie / The Problem of Weakness of Will in Medieval Philosophy, Peeters Publishers, 2006, 377pp., $87.00 (pbk), ISBN 9789042917798.

Reviewed by Martin Pickave, University of Toronto


Recent years have seen a revived interest in medieval moral psychology and the present volume, a collection of papers (in English, French, and German) presented at a conference in Jena in August 2004, provides a good example of this trend, which is aimed at rehabilitating the diverse contributions the Middle Ages made to moral philosophy. The editors do not just wish to remind modern readers of an often overlooked period of the history of philosophy; they also hope that an engagement with medieval accounts of weakness of will might make a contribution to contemporary debates. This, of course, depends on what the "problem of weakness of will", mentioned in the title of the collection, precisely amounts to. Traditionally, weakness of will (or better: voluntary action against one's own better judgment) has been considered problematic because practical knowledge seems to be the cause of genuinely human action. But if there is a strong causal connection between thought and action, how is it possible not to act in accordance with what we judge best? It is well known that many medieval authors deny that reason (and even practical reason) has any substantial causal force with regard to the will and that they thus grant knowledge only a very limited role in eliciting human actions. For these authors, often referred to as 'voluntarists', the phenomenon called "weakness of will" is not a problem at all but rather a simple fact and a good example of the causal inertia of practical reason. Since most of the contributions in the present collection discuss authors adopting the voluntarist stance, the "problem" to which the editors refer in the title clearly has to be understood more broadly. It seems to amount simply to this: what is the best way to describe situations in which an agent seems to act against her own better judgment? It is important to distinguish these two ways of understanding the "problem of weakness of will". With the present volume, the editors intend to correct the assumption, expressed for instance by authors such as W. Charlton, that medieval authors did not contribute anything substantial to solve the philosophical problems posed by weakness of the will. On the one hand, one might say that the contributions do not really disprove this belief, for the very possibility of weak-willed human action as such is not puzzling for most of the medieval authors discussed. But on the other hand, the essays convincingly show that the philosophical analysis of so-called weak-willed moral action is at the center of medieval moral psychology and theory of action (see, e.g., the excellent introduction by the three editors).

It is unfortunately beyond the scope of this review to discuss all of the 13 articles in detail. The contributions are ordered chronologically and cover roughly, one by one, the main figures in medieval philosophy. One consequence of this arrangement by authors (rather than by specific topics and problems related to weakness of will) is that it is relatively difficult to get a synthetic view of the debate on moral weakness. Was there among medieval authors a common view regarding the sort of knowledge the incontinent has while acting against it? And if not, how did the various views differ? Are incontinence and continence habits, as a certain reading of Aristotle seems to suggest, and if so, what kind of habits are they? Some of the contributions address these and other central questions individually, but they are in most cases not taken up again in the following articles.

This is especially unfortunate in light of the opening contribution by Terence Irwin on "Will, Responsibility, and Ignorance: Aristotelian Accounts of Incontinence", which brings to the stage many of the central issues regarding voluntary action against one's better judgment. In his article, Irwin first proposes an interpretation of Aristotle's account of incontinence by highlighting its Socratic elements. That Aristotle calls the incontinent open to persuasion is one of Irwin's main reasons for ascribing to the incontinent a rational failure, a problem with the "incontinent's rational outlook." This leads Irwin to examine Aristotle's claims about the incontinent's deliberation and choice. Most interesting is the second part of Irwin's highly stimulating paper, in which he presents Aquinas as building on Aristotle's rather sketchy remarks about choice and incontinence. As Irwin sees it, Aquinas develops two main accounts of the incontinent's choice: according to one, the incontinent actually elects the incontinent act because "he thinks in some particular case that he ought to act beyond right reason" (Aquinas, Commentary on the Nicomachean Ethics, book 7, lect. 8); according to the other, the incontinent elects the act by merely consenting to it. With respect to the first account, I am not entirely convinced that for Aquinas the incontinent really puts aside what right reason demands because she thinks, erroneously of course, that the present situation allows for an exception to right reason. In the very same passage that Irwin quotes in support of his interpretation, Aquinas also says that only "after the passions disappear" (cessante passione) the incontinent remains with the correct conception of the end. It thus looks as if for Aquinas the incontinent does not choose the dictate of his passions over right reason but rather that the passions put her temporarily in a condition of intemperance, in which her grasp of the correct conception of the end is temporarily lost (this interpretation finds also ample textual support in Aquinas's other writings). As for the second account, Irwin is absolutely convincing when he shows how Aquinas uses the idea of consent to explain the will's role in incontinent action. However, what remains unresolved in Irwin's contribution is how these two accounts of the incontinent's election exactly relate to each other. Are they meant to explain different kinds of incontinence?

To refer to the phenomenon in question as weakness of will, as the title of this volume does, evokes issues which are not necessarily associated with the phenomenon which the ancients called akrasia. It leads, for example, to the question of how it is that the will can be weak (or strong). The papers by Christian Schäfer and Bernd Goebel deal with this question rather than with the problem of voluntary action against one's better judgment. In Schäfer's treatment of weakness of will in Augustine, John of Damascene, and Pseudo-Dionysius, weakness of will is basically subsumed under the problem of the evil will, i.e,. under the question of how it is possible not to pursue one's natural goal. Of course, there are important connections between these two topics, yet Schäfer's perspective distracts him so much from the primary target of the rest of the volume that he almost overlooks the important contributions these Patristic authors made to the philosophical analysis of weak-willed action. To mention just one example: weakness of will is a central topic in Augustine's Confessions, especially in book VIII, chapters 9ff. Schäfer of course mentions these chapters, but the "monstrosity" of incontinence to which Augustine alludes there has definitely nothing to do with a divided soul à la Plato, as Schäfer believes. On the contrary, Augustine's texts contain an explicit criticism of divided-soul accounts of incontinence.[1] This criticism is one of Augustine's most original contributions to the analysis of weak-willed action. Goebel's contribution examines Anselm of Canterbury's conception of the will and shows that instead of allowing for weakness of will, Anselm rather defends the strength of the will. Contrary to Augustine for whom incontinence is characterized by a divided will (but not a divided soul!), Anselm sees no real inner conflict at work. Incontinence might "appear" as an inner conflict; there is however just one (bad) volition accompanied by a concomitant wish (but not a volition) for the opposite.

Two papers of the collection are devoted to authors of the 12th century. Jörn Müller reminds us that acting against better judgment is at the center of Peter Abelard's ethics insofar as Abelard defines sinning or evildoing precisely as acting against one's conscience. So Abelard is naturally very interested in how one can possibly want and desire something considered wrong. But it is less than clear exactly what willing or desiring actually means for Abelard. Müller's lucid examination of the different kinds of willing Abelard distinguishes in his ethical writings leads him to the conclusion that, strictly speaking, Abelard allows for two kinds of weakness of will: motivational weakness (one doesn't will what one considers best) and weakness in execution (one doesn't act in accordance with one's will). Both forms of weakness of will are grounded in a general weakness of human nature and both are overcome by virtue. Although Müller's arguments for distinguishing these two kinds of weakness in Abelard are quite convincing, one might wonder whether the distinction between them isn't obscured by Abelard himself insofar as Abelard assigns to them the same cause and the same remedy. Bernard of Clairvaux, a contemporary of Abelard, is the focus of Christian Trottmann's paper. Not unlike Anselm of Canterbury, Bernard too denies that incontinence represents a real inner conflict. The incontinent agent is only subject to self-deception with regard to her real motives. As Trottmann shows, Bernard is actually one of the first who expressly refers to incontinence as "weakness of will" (infirmitas voluntatis). The will, however, is weak not because it can be compelled and is incapable of resisting temptation (in this Bernard agrees with Anselm's emphasis on the strength of the will) but because it voluntarily turns to inferior goods and, as a result, weakens itself.

With Alexander Fidora's more philological paper on the Latin version of the so-called "Summa Alexandrinorum", an Arabic compendium on Aristotle's Ethics, we reach the 13th century and a new stage of the medieval debate over weakness of will, a stage marked by Aristotle's account in book VII of the Nicomachean Ethics. Whereas Martin Tracey provides the reader with an instructive introduction to the treatment of incontinence in the first of Albert the Great's two commentaries on Aristotle's Ethics, Tobias Hoffmann's paper on Aquinas is less concerned with Aquinas's interpretation of the details of the Aristotelian account of incontinence but rather focuses on the question of incontinence and moral development. This is an important issue because it seems quite appropriate to regard incontinence and continence as stages in our moral development towards virtue. Aristotle himself suggests such a picture, for example, when he compares, in a famous passage in book I of the Nicomachean Ethics, young people to the incontinent and when later in book VII he calls the incontinent open to persuasion (and what purpose could persuasion have if not the betterment of the person to be persuaded). Hoffmann's carefully argued contribution works out what, according to Aquinas, is required to progress from incontinence to continence and from continence to virtue in such a moral development. By doing so, Hoffmann also delineates the scope of Aquinas's moral philosophy. One of the claims Hoffmann attempts to defend is this: the fact that Aquinas's moral psychology includes a power such as the will allows him to provide a much better account of moral development than Aristotle does. Because of the will, so Hoffmann argues, it is possible for the incontinent to break the "chain of events" through which incontinent episodes occur. In this picture the will's role is to block the passions from taking command over reasoning and to turn the agent's attention to reason. I wonder whether this is a convincing picture of how incontinence is overcome. First, the role of the will seems to be overestimated. According to Aquinas, the will only acts because of a previous judgment of reason. So if the will prevents the passions from taking command in an incontinent agent, then this should happen because of reasoning. Yet such an agent looks very much like a continent agent (and not an incontinent one). But then we are back to the initial question: How can incontinence be overcome, i.e. how is it possible to get into a condition where reason takes over and is not completely dragged around by passion? Second, I do not think that we need to look for possible breakdown points in the incontinent's behavior itself to understand how incontinence is overcome. Let's go back to Aristotle's claim that the incontinent can be persuaded and cured. What kind of cure would be appropriate? We don't have to tell the incontinent person that what she is doing is wrong, for she already knows this. Punishment (or better: its announcement) is often named as one of the cures. But it may be more promising to come up with a strategy for avoiding situations in which we are likely to get overpowered by our passions. For Aristotle and Aquinas, incontinence occurs in the presence of strong passions, which presumably emerge in the necessary degree only in the presence of certain objects. If I avoid those objects and if I manage to perfect my moderated desires with regard to other objects to which I am generally less attracted, I might also at one point turn out to be no longer incontinent with regard to the things that previously caused me to abandon my better judgment. All this is to say that there might be other ways from incontinence to continence or virtue besides finding a way to interrupt the chain of events itself.

Theo Kobusch examines in his paper the diverging interpretations of the phenomenon of incontinence at the end of the 13th and the beginning of the 14th centuries. The article is in a sense the key article of the whole volume for it examines how the understanding of the phenomena corresponds to (and depends on) different attitudes with regard to the will as a self-determining faculty of the soul. For so-called voluntarists like Henry of Ghent and thinkers belonging to the Franciscan School, the phenomenon of weakness of will is merely a sign of the will's power of self-determination and of its superiority with respect to reason. According to this line of interpretation, Aristotle's discussion of the incontinent's knowledge in EN VII.3 is merely an illustration of how the intellect is affected by an aberrant will. For so-called intellectualists (who hold that the will is determined by reason) Aristotle's chapter is, on the contrary, an explanation of how incontinence is possible in the first place. Kobusch very competently maps out the debate and its principal figures in the period before and around the turn of the century. The following contribution by Alexander Brungs on the Correctoria controversy is a good complement to Kobusch's paper insofar as it further explores the debate between intellectualists and voluntarists. Incontinence seems not to have been a real issue in the Correctoria, but Brungs's essay contains some interesting remarks about the metaphysical background assumptions of the two conflicting parties.

If incontinence is considered as a clear sign of the will's power of self-determination then this suggests a much broader scope of incontinence than Aristotle -- for whom unqualified incontinence has to do only with the objects of food, drink, and sex -- was happy to allow for. It is thus not surprising that for voluntarist authors, incontinence and continence represent a certain degree of a moral condition: incontinence is the first degree of a bad moral condition (bestiality is the highest degree on this scale) and continence is among the first degrees of a good moral condition. As the papers by Timothy Noone and Matthias Perkams illustrate, John Duns Scotus and William of Ockham agree with this idea of degrees of moral conditions. The broadening of the scope of incontinence might also explain, as Noone remarks, why we do not find more than passing remarks on ("Aristotelian") incontinence in Duns Scotus's works. With Perkams's contribution on William of Ockham we also seem to be back in the conceptual framework of some 12th century authors. Yes, the will is strong insofar as it is not forced by the dictate of reason. But one can (as Perkams does) also look at this from a different angle, namely insofar as the nature of the will as something undetermined makes room for weakness of will, understood as the incapability to bring one's will in line with right reason. Its opposite, strength of will, would then be the will's power of self-determination in accordance with the dictates of right reason. I think Perkams has something like this in mind when he uses the terms 'strength of will' ("Willensstärke") and 'weakness of will' ("Willensschwäche"). The question is, however, whether Ockham would agree with this use of vocabulary; he does not talk explicitly about strength of will and his understanding of incontinence is more specific than what is covered by Perkams's term 'weakness of will'. For Ockham, as some of the passages quoted by Perkams make clear, incontinence refers to the abandoning of the dictate of reason under the influence of strong passions. I am also a bit worried about Perkams's attempt to equate weakness of will (in the way just described) and the genuine indeterminacy of the will. The indeterminacy of the will together with its power of self-determination is not a weakness; it is rather a sign of its freedom. And freedom is of course a necessary condition of all morally relevant actions and it is not particularly responsible for weakness. Anyhow, in my view the incontinent's problem seems to lie not so much in the indeterminacy of her will but rather in her determinate choice to abandon (although only momentarily) right reason.

The last contribution of the volume leaves the confines of the Middle Ages and turns to authors writing during the Renaissance and the Reformation. Risto Saarinen's paper, with its impressive mastery of historical circumstances, lays out a roadmap of post-medieval treatments of weakness of will and shows how the analysis of the phenomenon in this later period is transformed and enriched by the use of literary sources. Worth mentioning is also the extremely thorough bibliography, which covers almost everything that has ever been published on medieval treatments of the weakness of will.

In summary, the present collection of articles is a very welcome addition to the extant literature on medieval moral psychology. Despite minor reservations, I recommend it highly. Together with Risto Saarinen's monograph, this volume is and will remain, presumably for quite some time, an indispensable work for anyone interested in medieval accounts of weakness of will. I hope also that it will stand as an invitation for further study in that field.


[1] Cf., e.g., Scott MacDonald, "Augustine and Platonism: The Rejection of Divided-Soul Accounts of Akrasia," in Jorge J.E. Gracia & Jiyuan Yu (eds.), Uses and Abuses of the Classics: Western Interpretations of Greek Philosophy, Aldershot: Ashgate, 2004, pp. 75-88.