Death and Mortality in Contemporary Philosophy

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Bernard Schumacher, Death and Mortality in Contemporary Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 258pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521171199.

Reviewed by Steven Luper, Trinity University


In Death and Mortality in Contemporary Philosophy, Bernard Schumacher discusses the contemporary philosophical literature on the definition of "human personal death" (in Part One knowledge of "mortality and of human personal death" (Part Two); and "the axiological question of thanatology" -- that is, the question, is death bad for the people who die? (Part Three). As for the contemporary literature which he means to discuss, he says that it falls into two periods: work in the first half of the twentieth century, written by vitalists, phenomenologists, and existentialists, on one hand, and, "on the other hand, the recent controversy in analytical philosophy." (p. 3) With admirable candor, he makes it clear at the outset that he has an ax to grind when it comes to the analytic philosophy, which, he says,

is marked by a disregard for the arguments set forth during the first period. Indeed, it is not uncommon that the analytical philosophers propose, without any citation whatsoever, theses and arguments that strangely resemble those developed by the phenomenologists and existentialists. (p. 3)

It seems that the analytics steal from the ancients too; according to Schumacher, the arguments of Lucretius, Cicero, Montaigne, Seneca, Plutarch, Augustine, and Plato "strangely resemble those employed by proponents of analytical philosophy, although these more recent philosophers do not cite them." (p. 155)

Despite his beef with the analytics, Schumacher helps make it clear that writers such as Thomas Nagel, George Pitcher, and Fred Feldman address topics -- i.e., the nature and significance of death -- that were also addressed by writers such as Søren Kierkegaard, Martin Heidegger, and Jean-Paul Sartre, and also by Plato, Cicero and many other ancient theorists. Terminology and presuppositions vary from one of these groups of writers to the next, so it is not easy to bring all three into a single seamless discussion, but all three shed light on death, and, as Schumacher shows, each can be used to clarify the others.

Part One of Schumacher's book is actually a single brief chapter in which he discusses some attempts to define death. Legally, in most parts of the developed world, the mark of death is now taken to be the demise of the brain (or the brainstem). Key legislation has been shaped by a widely accepted definition of death, according to which the death of a human being occurs when its capacity to function as a whole is destroyed. Schumacher adopts this integration account of death (p. 48), but the defense he mounts for it is disappointing. Many opponents of the integration account argue that you and I are persons, that the capacity for self-awareness is essential to persons, and, therefore, that we persist if and only if we retain the capacity for self-awareness. It follows that death may occur long before a human being loses the capacity to function as a whole. Schumacher says the opponents of integrationism arrive at their view of personhood via the following flawed reasoning: something is a person only if its personhood is empirically verifiable, so being a person consists in "the empirical functioning of its so-called personal properties," such as self-awareness. (p. 31) He rejects this reasoning on the grounds that "in reality this functioning is only the verifiable expression of the ontological constitution that makes such a display of performance possible." What makes it possible for us to be self-aware is our humanity (the "ontological constitution" that makes self-awareness possible is the constitution of a human being), so a person and a human being are one and the same thing.

But Schumacher does not acknowledge that a human being can survive the complete loss of its "personal properties." This happens when people like Karen Quinlan become persistently vegetative. It isn't that properties such as self-awareness remain but are difficult or impossible to detect (as in locked-in syndrome). The ontological constitution that makes self-awareness possible -- for example, a functioning cerebrum -- is destroyed. (Schumacher denies this, but his grounds are unintelligible to me; speaking of Quinlan, he says "the concrete exercise of her self-consciousness has become impossible," but "her self-consciousness is still present in act at the level of her ontological constitution." [p. 32].) By Schumacher's own assumptions, then, the demise of a human being is not necessary for the demise of a person, persons and human beings are not one and the same, and integrationism is unacceptable.

In Part Two, Schumacher considers how we know about mortality. Having assumed, for the sake of argument, that death annihilates its victims, he notes that the dead never experience their condition, which suggests that no straightforward phenomenology of death is possible. He argues, contrary to Scheler, Heidegger, Levinas, Gadamer and Conche, that our knowledge of mortality is neither a priori, intuitive, nor instinctive. (Apparently these theorists did not know any teenagers.) Quite sensibly, he says, following Sartre, that we arrive at our knowledge of mortality using inductive reasoning: we see or read about the demise of people around us; none escape; our day will come.

Mortal knowledge is not the only thing Schumacher discusses in Part Two. There is also quite a bit about the relationship between death and the meaning of life. Schumacher is an insightful guide to the views of Heidegger and Sartre on this topic. He makes an interesting argument against a widespread reading of Heidegger, according to which Being-towards-death confers meaning upon human existence. (p. 103) As for Sartre's view, Schumacher explains it this way:

For Sartre, death wears the mantle of absurdity, for not only does it destroy every project and contradict the fundamental aspiration of the for-itself to become a being in-itself-for-itself, but it also and most importantly takes away from the dead for-itself the ability to give a meaning -- which comes from the future -- to its past free actions. The absurdity of death does not lie primarily in the return to nothingness of the for-itself, or in the suppression of its self-consciousness, but above all in the alienation (transfer of ownership) of its being-possible: the latter is at the mercy of the surviving-other who decides on what meaning to attribute to the life of the deceased and to his past actions. (p. 104)

In Part Three, Schumacher takes on the question of whether death is bad for those who die. His main target is an argument offered by theorists who are sympathetic to Epicurus: death is a matter of indifference since we cannot experience it, yet, as experientialism says, "a state of affairs is good or bad for a subject solely to the extent that the subject experiences it." (p. 42) Schumacher starts by asking whether it is fair to reject experientialism on the basis of some examples that he finds in the literature, including: betrayal we never notice, an illness that destroys our mental capacities and leaves us in a state equivalent to that of a contented infant, and unconsciousness induced by anesthesia or a blow to the head. He says these examples do not show that death harms those who die, since they "are located within a dialectic of life" and it is possible that the subject in each example could "still experience the evil that has happened to him." (p. 173) But why would being "located within a dialectic of life" preclude them from being counterexamples to experientialism? And as for the claim that the individual might later experience the evil that has happened to him, that seems true of betrayal, and maybe of the illness as well, but it is simply false in the case of unconsciousness. Schumacher also considers whether experientialism might be rejected on the grounds that some posthumous events harm us. According to Pitcher, this happens when posthumous events thwart our desires. Following Stephen Rosenbaum, Schumacher rejects Pitcher's view on the grounds that we no longer have the desires at the time that posthumous events occur. (p. 179) He neglects Pitcher's claim that posthumous events harm us retroactively: the harm they do us is incurred while we still have desires they thwart.

Nevertheless, Schumacher accepts the standard way of criticizing experientialism and defending the possibility of mortal harm, which relies on the view that we are harmed by what deprives us of goods (and benefitted by what precludes evils), as death can do whether we experience it or not. Most theorists who take this approach defend comparativism, which says that dying at a particular time harms us just if it makes our life worse than it would have been had we not died. On this view, dying is bad for us insofar as it deprives us of goods and good for us insofar as the life it deprives us of would be grim. Comparativism also implies that dying at age 100 would be neither good nor bad for us if, given human biology and the present state of medical technology, we simply cannot live any longer. (Suppose that I found an elixir or developed new technology that enabled me to live well for 200 years. In that case comparativism implies that dying at age 100 is bad for me. Similarly, if I have the means to live well forever, mortality is bad for me.) Like comparativists, Schumacher thinks that the explanation of mortal harm is that it deprives us of goods. However, he rejects the possibility that death might be good for us, as well as the claim that it might be neither good nor bad. He claims that, no matter when it occurs, death is "an evil in itself," by which he means it is an evil regardless of our circumstances. (p. 206)

To support his view, he cites Nagel, who argues that death is "in itself an evil" since:

There are elements that, if added to one's experience, make life better; there are other elements that … make life worse. But what remains when these are set aside is not merely neutral: it is emphatically positive. Therefore life is worth living even when the bad elements of experience are plentiful and the good ones too meager to outweigh the bad ones on their own. The additional positive weight is supplied by experience itself, rather than by any of its contents. (Nagel 1979, p. 62)

According to Schumacher, Nagel is saying that death is an evil regardless of the quality of the life its victim would otherwise have had; it is an evil because "it deprives the individual of something that he profoundly desires: to be, to exist, to live." (p. 205) In fact, death is an evil even if it is desired. In opting to die, what we are really doing is choosing "a greater loss that would be easier to endure" to "a smaller loss that is more difficult to endure." (p. 206)

Both Nagel and Schumacher assume that existing is intrinsically good for us. However, this assumption is easily questioned. Suppose you are about to die and only one thing can save you: an elixir called Persist. Persist will enable you to live on indefinitely, but at a price: unconsciousness. Once you take Persist, only a second drug can restore your consciousness: Demise. Unfortunately, you will remain conscious for no longer than one minute, just long enough to grasp your predicament, then you will die. Persist enables you to live on indefinitely. However, the wholly unconscious existence it gives you is of no benefit to you. Yet it would have to be if mere existence were intrinsically good for you. (What of Frances Kamm's Limbo Man, who prefers to put off some goods "by going into a coma and returning to consciousness at a later point to have them"? Does this example show, as Schumacher says, that "a human being, by his very nature, would prefer to postpone" death no matter how bad the "contents" of the additional life? [p. 191] Of course not. First, while it is true that few of us want our lives over, it is doubtful that our preferences line up with Limbo Man's. All we would gain from postponing our demise is a period of unconsciousness; who wants that? Second, Schumacher's own claim is much stronger than Kamm's example could possibly support; his view is that our preferences align with someone we might call "Misfortune Man," who would never opt for death no matter how horrific living on would be.)

Nagel says that perception, desire, and other things are "constitutive of human life" -- i.e., our being alive entails such things. (p. 62) Hence Schumacher and Nagel might be tempted to claim that Persist is lethal. But Nagel is mistaken; at best, our being alive entails the capacity to perceive and to desire. That is not destroyed by Persist.

However, suppose, for the sake of argument, that existing, together with some or all of the things that are "constitutive of" existing, is intrinsically good for us. Does it follow that death is invariably overall bad for us? That depends on how good mere existence is for us. Schumacher and Nagel think it is best to remain alive even if what we experience (the "contents" of experience) is, on the whole, horrible. It is good to live on given the enormous value of the activity of experiencing itself. Continued existence invariably brings with it things whose goodness could not possibly be outweighed by any combination of evils. But consider the people with advanced cancer who are enduring misery so intense it can be controlled only by keeping them unconscious (or by "terminally sedating" them). If the good of experiencing invariably outweighs the evil of what is experienced, these people are better off experiencing their ordeal, rather than being kept unconscious. Is it really better for them to die in agony?

There is no doubt that life can be extraordinarily good. Far too many people do not recognize how well off they are. However, do we really want to say that life cannot possibly fail to be overall good for us? That is the Panglossian position which Schumacher and Nagel have staked out for themselves. No one but a hedonist thinks that pain and pleasure are the only things that are intrinsically good or bad for us. Other things, such as loving relationships and certain achievements, are good too. However, unrelenting suffering, when severe enough, can blot out everything except the pain itself, and dementia can undermine our relationships and put an end to our ambitions. What good is left to offset our misery?

Some of Schumacher's readers will have reservations such as those I have just expressed. However, anyone interested in the philosophy of death will want to read Death and Mortality in Contemporary Philosophy. Schumacher's discussion reaches boldly across the ancient-contemporary and the analytic-continental divides. He uses each to shed light on the others, and makes novel contributions of his own.


Fischer, J.M., ed., 1993, The Metaphysics of Death. Stanford University Press.

Kamm, Frances, 1998, Morality, Mortality, Vol. 1, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Nagel, T., 1970, "Death," Noûs 4.1: 73-80. Reprinted in Nagel, T., Mortal Questions, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1979, and in Fischer 1993: 59-70. Page references are to the reprint in Fischer.