Defining Art, Creating the Canon: Artistic Value in an Era of Doubt

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Paul Crowther, Defining Art, Creating the Canon: Artistic Value in an Era of Doubt, Oxford University Press, 2007, 268pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199210683.

Reviewed by Ingvild Torsen, Florida International University


Is there any real future for an aesthetic approach to the definition of art? And can art's canonic values be given any justification in philosophical terms? Paul Crowther answers both questions with an emphatic "yes" (2). This explicit embrace of aesthetic value and optimism on behalf of a normative project is refreshing and exciting, since for half a century now the philosophy of art has been characterized by skepticism about normative theories and the value and legitimacy of traditional aesthetics. Crowther pitches his position as an alternative to those of various "naysayers," which include various strands of postmodern "Theory," including feminist and post-colonial art theory; new historicism; and what Crowther calls "Designation theories," represented by the work of Dickie and Danto. Opposed to these more descriptive and/or critical approaches to philosophy of art, Crowther is putting forth a normative theory that accounts for both the intrinsic, aesthetic value of art and the philosophical legitimacy of a canon.

Crowther's book is divided into three parts. Part I provides a negative justification of his project, arguing that most contemporary alternatives to his theory are unconsciously prejudiced against non-Western approaches to art. The core of his theory, elaborated in Part II, centers around two normative axes. The first allows Crowther to give a definition of art. The imagination, and the making of images, is necessary for our ability to cognize the world. Art is an extension and refinement of the imagination. For this reason, we are naturally disposed to find art fascinating, and art allows for further understanding of our world and ourselves. The second axis concerns what enables us to make distinctions in quality between artworks, and, hence, what makes it possible to defend a canon. When an artist can present an image that is stylistically innovative or exemplary, the artwork offers us new ways of experiencing the world. Hence, aesthetic originality is the criterion that decides whether a man-made image is to count as great art. Together the two axes define art as well as what makes art potentially valuable without drawing on features extrinsic to the work. It is "the reciprocity between art's intrinsic fascination and this comparative superiority which gives justification to the artistic canon" (8). Crowther's theory is a mimetic one, in which art is meaningful because of its stylistic interpretation of its object (3). On his very wide understanding of image as "aesthetic configuration," images can be found in any form of art (235). This general account of art is illustrated by applying it to different genres of art in the last part of the book. Part III is devoted to analyzing the imagination's role in understanding pictures, literary metaphor, the emotional aspect of music and the temporal and spatial construction of a focused moment in various art media.

This book is rich and sweeping, ambitious and dense, taking its reader through a fast-paced argument which addresses and borrows from cultural criticism, transcendental idealism, phenomenology, and hermeneutics. The book covers a lot of terrain and is for the most part written in a fairly argumentative style. There is much to think about here, but in the following I will focus on just three points that strike me as philosophically most challenging.

First, I want to focus on Crowther's claim that images are intrinsically fascinating for aesthetic reasons. This part of his theory is indebted to Kant's aesthetics and philosophy of mind, in particular the role of the imagination in concept formation and reflective judgments. The first axis of normativity follows from the claim that image-making is a central cognitive capacity and that art is an extension of this capacity. The imagination is not, for Crowther, a faculty but a "trans-ostensive" and "non-conceptual projective capacity" (32, 33). For example, to understand what a tree is is achieved by imagining what a tree would look like from other possible standpoints. Before we have a firm grasp of the concept 'tree,' we are able to point out trees aesthetically, by use of the imagination. The development of our cognitive life is a process that moves from a kind of imaginative play, in which we engage in the aesthetic activity of imagining possibilities, to a "fixing" of the world through the stable concepts of the understanding. Consequently, aesthetic experience is essential to what it is to be a human being. An artwork is a mental image made public through the artist working in a medium. When a mental image is made into an artwork, the working on the medium's material adds an important dimension to the image -- this is style. Style is the aesthetic dimension of an artwork and what makes art fascinating. To put it in Kantian vocabulary, what is fascinating about artworks is that we see the imagination's play made manifest in a sensible object; thus Crowther claims that we experience a "unique aesthetic mode of empathy" (114). When faced with the formal structures of an original artwork "we find the exemplification of fundamental structures in self-consciousness itself. The world of otherness echoes our own being; its foreignness is overcome" (116).

This is an interesting way of accounting for the importance of art in our lives. However, unless Crowther is presupposing a deep commitment to Kant's account of the mind, I do not see that he successfully establishes that the imagination is a necessary condition for knowledge or that the inherent fascination with images is due to aesthetic properties alone. The distinction between imagination and understanding is much harder to make if one gives up Kant's faculty psychology (indeed, it is hard even for Kant to make, which is apparent in the different roles attributed to the imagination in the A and B versions of the first Critique). It would seem appropriate here to engage some of the recent literature on perception and non-conceptual content from the intersection of phenomenology and cognitive science if Crowther wants to justify, or perhaps, to go beyond the Kantian framework.

Second, I want to address Crowther's characterization of the philosophical positions available to us with respect to the canon. Crowther seems to rule out that between affirmation and rejection, there is room for more nuanced views about the possibility of establishing a canon. Crowther claims that many current theoretical engagements with art are unwilling to commit to a normative theory and that these are thereby in fact buying into and strengthening the ideology of consumerism dominant in the era of late capitalism and that they are also unconsciously racist. By focusing on sign, socio-historical context and reception, relativist and anti-foundationalist approaches to art uphold the dominant ideology because they understand art in a manner that is analogous to the production-consumer model. Instead of undermining cultural hegemony and revealing latent power structures sedimented in artworks, the critical approaches of, for example, a feminist art historian like Griselda Pollock, are in fact based on "an almost fanatical consumerist viewpoint" (57). By contrast, through emphasizing the fact that an artwork harbors irreducible, transcultural and transhistorical aesthetic properties which reveal other ways of viewing the world, Crowther argues his own project is the one with a greater critical potential vis-à-vis a "market-driven western mindset"; normative aesthetics' resistance to such a mindset means that "cultural conservatism of the normative kind advocated here, can now, in principle, be a left-wing project" (64).

One of the philosophers whom Crowther targets is Arthur Danto. Crowther writes of Danto that "it would be difficult to find a grosser case of unconscious racism" (54). This is because Danto's definition of art privileges the ready-made at the expense of around "thirty thousand years of world wide artistic creation" (54). The background of this accusation is that Danto's definition of art is occasioned by Warhol's Brillo Box, an artwork which according to Danto can only be philosophically accounted for if the definition of art includes reference to the artworld (in terms of history and theory, rather than institutions). According to Danto, since Warhol's boxes are perceptually indiscernible from their ready-made counterparts in the supermarket, they reveal that aesthetic properties are not essential to what it is to be art. By contrast, Crowther grants the ready-made a merely honorific status as art (4). Of course, the reason why Danto does not advocate a normative theory is not because he thinks all artworks are equally good. Danto does not offer a normative theory for differentiating between artworks, because this is the job of art criticism and not philosophy. His wide definition is not meant to denigrate the value of aesthetic properties, rather, as Danto's own practice as a critic shows, questions of value and the role of aesthetic features are best addressed at the level of the particular artwork. Presumably, Danto is a skeptic about whether a philosophy of art could say something interesting about the meaning and value of art in general, but I am still not convinced that his position is thereby an example of "narcissistic western globalism which colonizes the cultural world with its distorted consumerist mind-set" (63).

Third, Paul Crowther shows that there are important reasons for making qualitative distinctions and he gives a justification for the possibility of a canon -- images are important for expanding our way of thinking about ourselves and the world and hence it is important to separate the edifying from the merely entertaining. However, the so-called canon wars were about the possibility of justifying a particular canon. It is not obvious that Crowther's criterion of stylistic originality makes this task any easier. The problem remains that any concrete canon will be susceptible to manipulation by all the extrinsic factors that postmodern criticism tries to bring attention to. Certainly, paying attention to style and medium-specific aesthetic features seems important for good criticism, but I am not convinced that these are the only criteria we should use, nor that they are necessarily always the most important criteria for engaging with man-made images. In other words, establishing that it is in principle possible to make distinctions based on quality between artworks is far from settling the question of which artworks ought to be part of the canon.

Despite these reservations, I found Crowther's book a stimulating read. It is unusually wide in its scope, it deals with several of the central questions for philosophy of art, and it offers an occasion to think hard about the deeper commitments we have both as philosophers and as art-lovers.