Deleuze and Spinoza: An Aura of Expressionism

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Howie, Gillian, Deleuze and Spinoza: An Aura of Expressionism, Palgrave, 2002, 238pp, $68.00 (hbk), ISBN 0333634675.

Reviewed by Todd May, Clemson University


Ostensibly, Deleuze and Spinoza is a critical reading of Deleuze’s interpretation of Spinoza in his book Expressionism in Philosophy: Spinoza. Deleuze published two books on Spinoza, but this one, although published two years earlier than Spinoza: Practical Philosophy, constitutes Deleuze’s central work on Spinoza. Deleuze and Spinoza attempts to show that Deleuze’s interpretation of Spinoza cannot save the latter from a number of problems that have become associated with Spinoza’s ontology and the ethical and political views he built upon it.

The aim of this critique, however, does not concern Spinoza as much as it concerns Deleuze. Howie contends that in Expressionism in Philosophy, Deleuze offers not simply an interpretation of Deleuze but a major statement of his own philosophy, a philosophy that, except in certain details, is of a piece with Spinoza’s. On this view, Deleuze’s philosophy stands or falls with his defense of Spinoza. If Deleuze’s Spinoza is wanting in coherence or plausibility, then so is Deleuze. The critique, then, aims past Spinoza to Deleuze himself. It is as though Expressionism in Philosophy contains Deleuze’s philosophy in germ or in summary, and thus its faults will spread themselves across the entirety of Deleuze’s corpus.

Moreover, although the book spends little time defending this (or the previous) claim, inasmuch as Deleuze is a representative of postmodernism in general, the failures of Expressionism in Philosophy are failures of postmodernism. “The postmodern,” she writes, “new ageist thirst for satisfaction, for the experience of uncoded or unlimited intensity; indeed, for fulfillment, is quenched on the philosophy of Gaia, of univocal Being, the One, the Whole.” (p. 9)

I will look at these conclusions, especially the one concerning the place of Expressionism in Philosophy in Deleuze’s corpus, in a bit. First, I would like to summarize the problems Howie finds with the Deleuze/Spinoza she finds in the text. Near the end of the book (p. 202), she lists a number of problems for which, according to Yovel, Hegel takes Spinoza to task. Her own critique largely follows these.

First, Deleuze/Spinoza does not give us an adequate defense of the idea of a single substance. He has not even defended the idea that there is any substance at all behind the modes or attributes. Second, he does not have an adequate defense of the existence of finite modes. Third, the parallelism between the attributes of Thought and Extension is incoherent. Fourth, Deleuze/Spinoza’s epistemology is unconvincing. Fifth, the ethical naturalism derived from the ontology amounts to no more than an acceptance of the determined path of the universe. Sixth, all of this issues out onto an untenable individualism. In short, Deleuze/Spinoza’s philosophy combines an ontology that wavers between implausibility and incoherence in the service of an ethics of resignation and a politics of individualism.

It should be emphasized here that these criticisms are not simply stated. They are defended in detail both by reference to the appropriate texts in Spinoza and Deleuze and by considering a variety of defenses that could be made of Deleuze/Spinoza’s position, showing why in the end these defenses are unconvincing.

It would be beyond the scope of this review to rehearse the arguments for Howie’s criticisms. However, as she notes, most of them converge on a single problem, which she sites after her reference to Yovel’s discussion of Hegel’s Spinoza. “It should be clear that these criticisms of Spinoza are true of Deleuze and each can be traced back to the problematic relationship of Thought and Extension.” (p. 202). Indeed, the text seems to take this problematic relationship as a centerpiece for criticism. For instance, part of the difficulty of the parallelism is that whatever happens in Thought must also happen (although not in the same way) in Extension and vice versa, without the one happening causing the other happening. One can see the difficulties here. How will this parallelism allow us to give an account of the “aboutness” of mental states? In what ways does the causality between states of Extension reflect a causality between states of Thought?

These difficulties will be familiar to those who have immersed themselves in the study of Spinoza. If the argument of Deleuze and Spinoza were solely this, it would be a book about a book about Spinoza, showing how ultimately there are problems with Spinoza’s philosophy that Deleuze’s sympathetic interpretation cannot fix. As such, it is an interesting book.

Howie, however, is emphatic that this is not the goal of the book. The book is not simply a critique of an interpretation of Spinoza; it is a critique of Deleuze. One strategy for making this critique stick would be to investigate the other works of Deleuze, particularly from Difference and Repetition forward, to show how the criticized elements of the Spinoza book are woven into the later philosophy. Howie, however, does not choose this tack. Instead she identifies Deleuze as a Spinozist tout court and thus holds that her critiques of Spinoza hold without emendation for Deleuze. In doing so, she does not shy away from the implications of her position. She holds, for instance, that “by stressing the immanence of God and his identity with the whole of reality, Deleuze distances himself from Nietzsche’s atheism.” (p. 192) Contrary to what appears in many of the later texts, then, Deleuze is, among other things, a theist of sorts.

Is Deleuze’s interpretation of Spinoza at the same time a statement of his own philosophy? Specifically, do the problems that plague Spinoza and that converge on the parallelism of attributes carry over without remainder into Deleuze’s work? It is surely the case that Deleuze finds much to appreciate in Spinoza, especially with regards to the concepts of immanence, expression, and the univocity of Being. In his late text with Felix Guattari, What is Philosophy?, Deleuze goes so far as to call Spinoza the Christ of philosophers. But is Deleuze a Spinozist lock, stock, and barrel?

I confess that I do not recognize the Deleuze Howie finds in Expressionism in Philosophy, and in particular I do not find an embrace of the problematic relationship of the attributes. In Difference and Repetition (tr. Paul Patton, Columbia University Press, 1994, p. 40), published the same year as Expressionism in Philosophy, Deleuze writes:

Spinoza’s substance appears independent of the modes, while the modes are dependent on substance…Substance must itself be said of the modes and only of the modes. Such a condition can be satisfied only at the price of a more general categorical reversal according to which being is said of becoming, identity of that which is different, the one of the multiple, etc.

There are two points worth noting about this passage. First, it does not endorse Spinoza’s view uncritically; second, it does not even refer to the attributes.

That Deleuze retains Spinoza’s idea of the univocity and immanence of being is beyond doubt. However, his own thought, as he begins to lay it out in Difference and Repetition, contains nothing of the attributes. If we look further along in Deleuze’s corpus, we see the same silence on attributes in the later collaborations with Felix Guattari. Their reflections on Spinoza in . Thousand Plateaus have no equivalent concept of attributes, although substance and modes do make an appearance.

In this area, Deleuze’s thought is characterized not by the tripartite division into substance, attributes, and modes, but into the bipartite division into the virtual and the actual (a division Howie notes only in passing), where the former is akin to substance and the latter to modes. One might want to raise here the question Howie raises to Deleuze/Spinoza of how the unfolding of the virtual into the actual (immanent causality) allows for causal relations among elements of the actual (transitive causality). That is a fair question, one that goes to the relationship of Deleuze’s ontology and science. Manuel de Landa’s recent Intensive Science and Virtual Philosophy (Continuum, 2002) offers an account of that relationship, trying to show, among other things, how transversal causality would work in such an ontology. However, absent the commitment to attributes, the difficulty Deleuze faces is not the one Spinoza faces and that Howie would like to saddle Deleuze with.

The example I have discussed here is only one indication that Expressionism in Philosophy is not a statement of Deleuze’s philosophy but rather an attempt to read Spinoza as sympathetically as possible. Another one, I should note in passing, is that, unlike Spinoza, Deleuze is not committed to predeterminism or, as Howie terms it, “necessitarianism.” His discussion of the dice throw in Nietzsche and Philosophy as well as his embrace of the scientific work of Jacques Monod and Ilya Prigogine demonstrate that chance plays a role in Deleuze’s ontology that has no equivalent in Spinoza. In the end, then, it is impossible to offer an assessment of Deleuze’s thought through this single work, or through any single work of Deleuze’s (although admittedly certain texts, Difference and Repetition among them, are more crucial to that task).

Regarding the most general claim that Deleuze/Spinoza’s commitments are founding for postmodernism in general, there is little discussion in Deleuze and Spinoza as to what the vexed term “postmodernism” means, and therefore which strain of postmodernism Deleuze/Spinoza is said to contribute to.

A final note. There is an unfortunate tone of cynicism in Deleuze and Spinoza regarding not only Deleuze’s project but also his philosophical motives. At one point, Howie accuses Deleuze of a “lack of sincerity” (p. 170). One might disagree with a philosopher’s views, but to attack a philosopher’s integrity is another matter altogether. In light of the fact that no evidence is brought forward to justify such an accusation, attacks such as these can only serve to diminish philosophical discussion and disagreement.