Deleuze, Guattari and the Production of the New

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Simon O'Sullivan, Stephen Zepke (eds.), Deleuze, Guattari and the Production of the New, Continuum, 2008, 245pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826499530.

Reviewed by Peta Malins, University of Melbourne



The recent proliferation of books and anthologies focusing on the work of Deleuze and Guattari has been a cause for both celebration and concern. There is something unsettling about a growing commercial interest in the field: a sense that a kind of Deleuzo-Guattarian industry might be emerging, with publishers and authors churning out increasingly short-hand, commodified interpretations of their thought. Yet there is also something inescapably exciting about it all too: a sense of anticipation and delight at both the rhizomatic spread in and of itself, as well as a the possibilities that each new encounter might open up for rethinking — and re-doing — the contemporary world.

It was with this latter optimism that I approached Simon O’Sullivan and Stephen Zepke’s Deleuze, Guattari and the Production of the New. Fortunately, O’Sullivan and Zepke’s collection not only explores the importance of the ‘new’ to our future ethico-political health, but attests to it in its very being. Rather than re-hashing familiar Deleuze and
Guattari territory, or simply capitalizing on the quirkiness of their unfamiliar concepts, this collection offers innovative in-depth encounters between these philosophers and an array of political and artistic assemblages and problematics. In doing so it necessarily shifts the ways in which we can think about Deleuze and Guattari’s concepts and the various fields to which they have been connected. The collection thus acts, at least to some extent, like a lever with which we might, as Massumi suggests, begin to pry open a gap in the ‘World As We Know It’.1

The main aim of the anthology is to explore — and put to work — the concept of the new as it emerges from the work of Deleuze and Guattari, particularly their jointly authored Capitalism and Schizophrenia texts and Guattari’s relatively under-utilized individual works. This is a daunting task, given the central role that the production of the new plays within their philosophy: as the generative force of differentiation that drives life itself in its battle against stagnation, habit and paralysis. The editors do well, therefore, to narrow the field by outlining a range of subsidiary aims, or problematics, to which the collection is addressed. These include: the role of art and aesthetics in the production of new modes of thought and being; the capacity for repetition to become aligned with difference, rather than with recognition and representation; the problem of the new in relation to contemporary capitalism, given the extent to which creativity and innovation are being increasingly co-opted by mass marketing rhetoric and practice; and the role of the new in contemporary forms of resistance.

The anthology comprises 18 specifically commissioned essays, which each take up and extend at least one of these themes. These are preceded by a thoughtful and accessible editorial introduction, and followed, at the end of the collection, with a newly translated extract from Guattari’s Cartographies Schizoanalytiques, which is itself accompanied by a short translator’s introduction. Of the commissioned essays, some focus on a particular philosophical or political problematic relating to the new in Deleuze and Guattari’s work, drawing out dynamic concepts of difference and repetition, time, the future, ethics, the virtual, experimentation, resistance, desire and creativity. Others focus on connecting the concept of the new to particular artistic and aesthetic sites. From science fiction to jazz, contemporary art to industrial music, cinema to cultural icons, these more grounded essays bring to life Deleuze and Guattari’s concepts, putting them to work in familiar, and not so familiar, domains.

Given the wide range of themes, approaches, styles and subject matter that the anthology covers, it is perhaps a pity that the essays do not seem to have been arranged according to any particular order or thematic structure. Daniel Smith’s “Deleuze and the Production of the New”, for example, would have been a great essay with which to have begun the collection, for it does a great job of outlining the concept of the new within Deleuze and Guattari’s (albeit primarily Deleuze’s) thought. Arguing that the new, for Deleuze, operates as ‘fundamental ontological concept’, Smith shows how it works to shift the focus of philosophical thought from the universal and eternal, to the singular, immanent and emergent (151). By providing vivid examples and analogies — from water boiling to someone breaking down in tears, from the singularity of the four corner points of a square to the inability to ever fully predict weather systems — Smith brings to life some of the more complex aspects of Deleuze’s metaphysics of difference, making it accessible to readers unfamiliar with his work.

Maurizio Lazzarato’s “The Aesthetic Paradigm” provides a nice balance to Smith’s focus on Deleuze, turning as it does to Guattari’s work and the role of aesthetics in the production of a technology and ethics of the self. Noting that Guattari’s aesthetic paradigm is not about an aestheticization of the political, nor is it about avant guard art practice, Lazzarato shows how it is instead about apprehending the forces that express affective, sensory and bodily changes in the world in order that we might make everyday life — one’s way of being in the world — a kind of artistic and creative practice. Guattari’s idea, he writes, was ‘not to take art as an institution as our point of departure, but rather to utilize its techniques, its processes of creation and its practices in order to let them evolve into other domains’ (175).

This potential for transversality is elegantly illustrated by Eugene Holland in his essay “Jazz Improvisation: Music of the People-to-Come”. Through the delicate Deleuzo-Guattarian concept of the refrain, Holland shows how, through repetition of a basic chord structure, improvisational jazz creates the conditions for unrehearsed moments of creative rupture, whether deliberate or accidental, where new, unexpected notes can shift bare mechanical repetition into repetition with a difference. Drawing distinctions between the open refrains of jazz and the closed refrains of both classical music (where sheet music, a conductor and orchestral arrangements ensure minimal deviation) and commodified pop (where commercial interests ensure the production of music that pleases and distracts) Holland effectively makes the case that jazz improvisation not only affirms the production of difference, but has the potential to imbue in its audience — its ‘people to come’ — the importance of creativity, and the need to continually overcome habit through the production of the new. As Holland suggests, the kinds of spontaneous refrains mobilized through jazz might also, in other non-musical domains, have the capacity to shift static ways of being. He writes: ‘the political challenge is to organize social relations so that as we launch forth on the thread of a tune, we hazard an improvisation that joins us with the World and a people to come, rather than endlessly and mechanically repeating fixed refrains’ (204).

The idea that forms of artistic repetition can enable creative differentiation is also taken up by Michael Goddard in “Sonic and Cultural Noise as Production of the New: The Industrial Music Media Ecology of Throbbing Gristle”. Goddard effectively mobilizes the example of Throbbing Gristle — an (un)popular 1970s industrial music and transgressive performance group — to show how the use of sampling and appropriation (industrial noises, album cover art, clothing, body art, modes of communication, musical and performance genres) can be mobilized as a force of creative differentiation. Throbbing Gristle‘s strategy of using repetition to mess with culturally accepted and anticipated sensory forms, combined with their refusal to identify with any one particular genre or aesthetic style, provide Goddard with a means of linking creative repetition to the (Deleuzian) concept of internal, generative difference: where difference is not defined in relation to something else but as an ever-evolving self-differentiation, which enables the production of the new. It is in this sense that Goddard sees Throbbing Gristle as a kind of ’war machine’ against aesthetic complacency: working to challenge existing modes of listening, watching and being; producing not only new sounds and images, but new audiences too (168).

As commodity capitalism continues to extend its domination over the social desiring field, accelerating its global deterritorialisations (and corresponding reterritorialisations), finding creative ways to challenge existing modes of being and perceiving becomes increasingly urgent. In “Alterity and Desire”, Bifo writes in self-described ‘apocalyptic tones’ about the current capitalist state of affairs, arguing that ‘there is no alternative to capitalism because, by becoming semio-capitalism, it has swallowed in the grinding machine of exchange value not only life forms, but also thought, imagination and hope’ (32, 30). He does nonetheless suggest one way forward, via a new ethico-aesthetics of the soul: a recomposition of bodies such that one can again ‘open empathetically to the other’ and become attuned to sadness, entropy, aging and death, but without being frozen by them (31).

Alberto Toscano’s “In Praise of Negativism” is also less than optimistic about the possibilities for creative resistance within capitalism, noting that creativity is here always stunted by the ‘bottom line’ (56). Like Bifo, however, he does hold out some hope, suggesting that if creativity is primary in relation to capitalism, then a reappropriation of creativity is possible, perhaps even imminent (56). It is language to which Toscano then turns as the key site where creativity has been colonized (via communication and marketing), and where possibilities for creative resistance (through a deterritorialized ‘stuttering’ and ‘stammering’: an ‘anti-production’) might reside.

As the editors note in their introduction, a book of philosophical essays might not seem like much of a weapon against contemporary globalised capitalism, yet it certainly has the capacity to form part of a war machine when it is combined with — or plugged into — other assemblages. While this anthology does not resolve the problems of globalised capital, it does act as a timely reminder of the importance of continually engaging in practices that disturb present modes of being. More importantly, it serves to remind us that such practices, if they are to be revolutionary, must involve not only rupture (oppositional critique and deconstruction; protests and sabotage) but also creativity (the active composition of alternative modes of being, as an open production of the new). Long neglected in movements of counter-capitalism, such creativity is being increasingly mobilized in playful forms of alter-capitalist resistance and activism. The anthology affirms the importance of these shifts and the importance of celebrating the unusual, the unexpected, the unrecognizable — whether in resistance, in art or in life more generally — for our own health and joy and for the possibility of new futures.

Readers will find much to enjoy within this collection, whether they are familiar with Deleuze and Guattari’s work or approaching it fresh. Newer readers might, however, struggle with some of the essays, particularly if they are also approaching them from outside the study of philosophy proper, given that many of the works assume at least some level of prior knowledge. This is not helped by the anthology’s lack of thematic structure, and by its relatively dense final essay — Guattari’s “Consciousness and Subjectivity” — which seems an odd choice, given that it deals with the production of molecular understandings of subjectivity, libido and the unconscious, rather than the production of the new as such.

The collection is, however, a strong one: well-written, entertaining and diverse. Further, its lack of formal structure and closure does have certain advantages, not the least that it remains true to some of Deleuze and Guattari’s key ethical imperatives, namely: the importance of opening up movement and forging rhizomatic and transversal connections between problems and concepts. Too much structure, and readers may not venture far outside their comfort zone; too much organization and readers will be less likely to stumble upon something unexpected. Too much order, moreover, and there is a danger that the new will turn out to be exactly what we anticipate it to be. For it is through the creation of such uncertain and open encounters that we can really affirm the production of the new as the force of a present-yet-to-come and, through this, forge a space for new, unforseen futures.

1 Massumi, Brian (1992) A User’s Guide to Capitalism and Schizophrenia: Deviations from Deleuze and Guattari, MIT Press: Cambridge, Massachusetts, p. 103.