Democratic Enlightenment: Philosophy, Revolution, and Human Rights 1750-1790

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Jonathan I. Israel, Democratic Enlightenment: Philosophy, Revolution, and Human Rights 1750-1790, Oxford University Press, 2011, 1066pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199548200.

Reviewed by Omri Boehm, The New School for Social Research


Spinoza was no passionate supporter of revolutions. He argues in the Theological-Political Treatise that they are bound to fail: a people used to illegitimate rule would forever overthrow one tyrant only to replace him by another (TTP 18, 235). The reason for this tendency, Spinoza explains, is that the masses are too quickly pleased by novelties -- new tyrants -- that have "not yet proved illusory" (TTP Preface, 16). This argument is directed at political revolutions, but the point applies equally well to 'revolutions of the mind'. Anyone following Spinoza's spirit would have to ask whether enlightenment modernity did not overthrow the tyranny of revelation only to replace it by a novel tyranny -- reason's -- whose authority had not yet proved illusory. This question is especially disquieting when Spinoza's own, radical, revolutionary Enlightenment is concerned; and this raises some doubts about the ultimate success of Jonathan Israel's bold, masterfully comprehensive trio -- hardly requiring an introduction -- now culminating in the third volume, Democratic Enlightenment: Philosophy, Revolution, and Human Rights 1750-1790.

The basic structure of Israel's account is by now well known. It consists in the confrontation between the radical (clandestine) and the moderate (mainstream) strands of Enlightenment, on the one hand; and in the clash between these two strands with the counter-Enlightenment and with existing socio-political powers, on the other. Israel does justice to the impact -- virtually ignored in earlier literature -- of Spinoza's thinking on the development of ethics, political thinking and society in Europe, America and throughout the world. Communicated through authors such as Diderot and D'Holbach, Spinoza's unrelenting rationalism dictates materialist substance monism and is, as such, universalistic and secular. It crowns reason as the sole legitimate authority, rejects teleology and asserts an uncompromising toleration (cf. pp. 12ff.). This story is familiar from Israel's previous volumes, but in this book another defining characteristic of radical thinkers comes to the fore, namely, support of the Revolution. "Ardent long-standing adherents of radical ideas," Israel writes, "instantly embraced the Revolution" as the "apotheosis of the Enlightenment" (pp. 16f.). Moderate-minded enlighteners by contrast "were never willing to recognize the Revolution as anything of the sort" (ibid.). The irony with this characterization is that Spinoza himself, as we just saw, would not have comfortably fit. While this needn't undermine Israel's classification, this volume (and this trio) could have had more room for reflection on complications of the sort.

The moderate strand of Enlightenment opposing the radical strand, in Israel's narrative, embraces reason's authority and that of revelation; defends teleology along with science and supports some but not general toleration. Thinkers on Israel's moderate list include Voltaire, Locke, Hume and, perhaps most significantly, Kant. Crucial in this picture is the moderates' acceptance of teleology -- a metaphysical worldview justifying the old systems of value and, thereby, contradicting a general revolution (cf. p. 19). The present volume, covering the years 1750 through 1790, develops this narrative in five main parts: 'The Radical Challenge' (considering some counter- and moderate reactions to the Spinozist materialism of Diderot); 'Rationalizing the Ancien Régime' (in which the reverberation of Enlightenment principles -- moderate and radical -- into existing political powers is analyzed); 'Europe and the Remaking of the World' (emphasizing the impact of European radicalism across the globe -- e.g., on the American Revolution and Declaration of Independence, but also extending the discussion to, e.g., China and Japan); 'Spinoza Controversies in the Later Enlightenment' (analyzing the entry of radical thinking into public debate from its clandestine background -- as in the case of the Pantheismusstreit); and finally, 'Revolution' (highlighting the emergence of radical values and ideas into the fore of society -- culminating with an explanation of the French Revolution as a result of the radical Enlightenment; and then with the surgical explaining-away of the Revolution's terrors as grounded in the philosophy of the counter-, not radical, Enlightenment).

One fundamental assumption guiding this project is that there is a causal relation -- though not one Israel understands simplistically (cf. pp. 950f.) -- between metaphysics and ethics (and politics). Materialistic substance monism on this account is grounding the radicals' unyielding support of equality, democracy, freedom and universal tolerance. Critics of previous volumes, who wanted to dismiss Israel's methodology by rejecting the "assumed homology between philosophical and political stand points,"[1] are in this volume effectively countered. Israel's answer is, in brief: "There is no such thing as a non-philosophical account of the Enlightenment" (p. 937);

To overthrow 'despotism,' the entire human reality must be transformed, which can only be done by eradicating people's existing beliefs and attitudes, something impossible for the masses and totally unacceptable to monarchs, aristocrats, and clergy. Hence, 'philosophy' is the only possible engine of a 'General Revolution' (p. 939).

This answer is plausible, and its plausibility isn't diminished by the claim, made in a recent New York Times commentary on this volume, that "the brave men and women of Tahrir Square had no need of one-substance materialism to free themselves from despotism."[2] In fact, to the extent that Tahrir's revolutionaries fought for justified individual rights, freedom of thought and material amelioration, they de facto committed themselves to (something like) materialistic substance monism. They did so to the same extent that those revolting in Tahrir in the name of al-Gama'a al-Islamiyya assumed dualistic metaphysics and the authority of revelation -- not reason. The connection between metaphysics, ethics and politics cannot be as easily severed as postmodern and post-Kantian historians and philosophers have come to think (Rawls' avowal, 'Political not Metaphysical,' comes to mind here). Israel's willingness to get his hands dirty telling the Enlightenment's story from the standpoint of the metaphysical-political rapport is one of the great merits of his project.

Yet precisely if we take the connection between metaphysics and ethics seriously, questions arise about Spinoza's radical project and about Israel's recounting of its history. It isn't clear that substance monism genuinely grounds anything like equality, freedom and non-relativistic toleration. Much more likely, it undermines commitment to these rights by cutting the underpinnings of all rationally justified, normative accounts of value. There are several problems here, of which I will briefly mention two.

First, the crowning of reason in the place of revelation requires, insofar as all kinds of brute authority are rejected, some sort of rational justification. Here is a problem because the defining rationalist principle, the Principle of Sufficient Reason -- meticulously observed by Spinoza on his way to substance monism -- has never been successfully justified, to say nothing of proved. Therefore, following this principle reveals a surprising willingness to depend on the authority of dogma and faith, not argument. This problem is genuine, and ought not be dismissed -- as I suspect Israel is tempted to dismiss it (cf. the account of Hume's 'skeptical moderation' [pp. 209-33]; or of Kant's reaction to the Pantheismusstreit [pp. 707-712]) -- as mere polemics of moderate- or counter-Enlightenment thinkers. Especially because Spinoza and his followers were willing to derive the "paradoxical proposition" that whether individuals "wish to or not they 'shall be compelled to live according to the percept of reason'" (p. 636); especially because they were willing to insist that whoever refuses to obey rational decree "'shall be compelled to do so'" and thus "'be forced to be free'" (ibid.), one must worry that the rational premise itself has never been rationally justified. The radicals had better been reminded of Spinoza's prophecy here: that revolutions ever install new tyrants in lieu of old ones; that we are quickly pleased by novelties that have "not yet proved illusory." Indeed it is not until Kant that reason's illusory nature is problematized.

Second, it may be too hasty to dismiss teleology as an obscene metaphysical worldview, serving nothing but the justification of "monarchical-aristocratic society sanctioned by ecclesiastical authority" (cf. p. 726). Arguably at least some sort of teleology is required for grounding any value at all, for values, as such, depend on the existence of hierarchies. For example, to meaningfully say that everybody has equal rights one must be willing to say that everybody falling within a certain category is more equal -- has more rights -- than whoever falls outside that category. This is dangerous, of course, as it enables the exclusion of some groups from the category of equals, but guarding against this danger by saying that everything is of equal value because nothing has value at all is not much of a solution. The ethics of Spinoza's Ethics cannot but culminate in the proposition that we never "desire anything because we judge it to be good," but always "judge something to be good" because "we desire it" (E IIIp9s). Supplemented with the assumption that human desire or existence can have no normatively privileged position -- a claim entailed by Spinoza's categorical rejection of teleology -- this proposition amounts to asserting a relativistic ethics of the will to power. It is therefore with good reason that this grave anti-humanist opponent of equality, toleration, democracy and Enlightenment -- Nietzsche -- found in the Jew from Amsterdam a soul-mate. "I have a precursor, and what a precursor!" he writes:

this most unusual and loneliest thinker is closest to me precisely in these matters: he denies the freedom of the will, teleology, the moral world order, the unegoistic, and evil . . . my lonesomeness, which, as on very high mountains, often made it hard for me to breathe and made my blood rush out, is now at least a twosomeness. Strange.[3]

In this light, the attempt to counter postmodern relativism -- culminating in "Foucault's claim that the Enlightenment's insistence on the primacy of reason was ultimately just a mask for the exercise of power" (pp. 1f.) -- by 'returning' to Spinoza's metaphysics will have to fail. Postmodernist relativists are in fact heirs of the radical, not of the counter-, Enlightenment.

This complicates not only the philosophical motivation of this project but also some of the historical judgments. A case in point is Israel's recount of the radicals' volonté générale -- the idea that

to live securely and as well as possible, men must unite their efforts so that the absolute right of each individual to do whatever he or she could do in the state of nature is transposed into the absolute power over the whole of the state 'according to the power and will of all at the same time' (p. 636).

As Israel convincingly shows, Rousseau received the general idea from Spinoza, Diderot and d'Holbach (cf. pp. 94f.), but introduced a crucial difference: while for the Spinozists the general will was "inherent to reason and not something defined by being willed," in Rousseau it is grounded exactly in the "people's will" rather than reason (p. 636). This -- so the argument goes -- is the crucial step degrading the radicals' general will into what Hannah Arendt would call the "curious equation of will and interest" (p. 638): it is the decisive move towards the relativistic grounding of legitimacy not in reason but in "feeling and sentiment that is particular rather than universal" (p. 640). As we have seen, however, the Enlightenment's step towards the "curious equation" of will with interests isn't found in Rousseau. It is found in Spinoza. The first serious attempt to deal with this difficulty in defending Enlightenment universalism is Kant's later twist on the volonté générale, in his account of the categorical imperative. (More on Kant and the radicals below.)

Similar complications shade the discussion of the American Revolution and the Declaration of Independence. On a naïve view, the Declaration is saturated mostly with moderate, predominantly Lockean, religious, teleological baggage. Certainly its famous reference to the rightful "station" given to all men by "the laws of Nature and Nature's God" suggests strong teleological presumptions. This can be somewhat embarrassing for secular rationalists, and it squares badly with Israel's thesis that the revolution's driving force was the radical rather than the moderate Enlightenment. The problem, as Jeremy Waldron recently put it, is that secular liberals (like Israel and myself) are "taking advantage of a tradition" they pretend "to repudiate".[4] Israel attempts to reclaim the Declaration to the secular tradition by a detailed recount of Jefferson's radical background (e.g., the influence of Tom Paine). The discussion is extremely revealing, culminating in the conclusion that the Declaration "offered concepts more broadly in line with radical than moderate Enlightenment principles" (p. 457). The main textual evidence supporting this claim isn't convincing, however: Israel refers here to the aforementioned moment in the Declaration in which the teleological lingo of humanity's "place" in "Nature's God" is invoked (p. 457). Besides, the problem isn't textual but conceptual. For better or worse, teleological assumptions about humanity's natural place aren't a merely moderate religious baggage, sustaining the values of the church. Such assumptions may be conceptual prerequisites for rationally asserting these truths to be self-evident: that all men are created equal, that they are endowed with unalienable rights, that among these are life, liberty and the pursuit of happiness.

The most serious attempt to deal with this predicament is found in Kant's attack on radical metaphysics. That Kant at all reacted to Spinoza and to Spinozism is something that Kant readers have so far virtually ignored, on the assumption that Kant's critique of dogmatism is directed at the (moderate) rationalism of Leibniz and Wolff. There are reasons to think that this view is distorted, and Israel deserves much credit for pointing this out: "Throughout his earlier pre-critical phase as well as in many passages of the Critique [Kant] conducts a kind of silent war against Spinoza (something modern Kant specialists are often curiously blind to)" (p. 707). This important claim would be very controversial, but isn't defended against the foreseen specialists' objections by discussing or referring to passages from the Critique. If one had to defend Israel's claim here, however, it should be possible to do so (cf. Critique A453-8/B481-6; A578f./B606f.; A727-38/B755-66).

For Israel, Kant's war on Spinoza represents the most "finely crafted, consummate" defense of moderate values (p. 729). Plausible as this may seem, it is too quick. First, it isn't clear that the pre-critical Kant indeed waged war on Spinoza. Key pre-critical essays such as the Beweisgrund or the Nova Dilucidatio, discussed by Israel as manifestations of Kant's siding with the religious Enlightenment of Crusius (pp. 195-200), can also be read as supporting radical metaphysics substance monism in the Beweisgrund and necessitarianism in the Nova Dilucidatio. This would suggest a reading very different from Israel's (p. 710) of Kant's later explicit assertion, in the context of the Pantheimussterit, that if his critical philosophy isn't adopted, "only Spinozism remains" (KpV 5:102). But this is admittedly very controversial and cannot be settled here. Important is that Kant's critical attack on Spinozism isn't merely a moderate defense of "faith and traditional morality" (p. 722). The critical Kant isn't defending faith and teleology for the sake of religion or church authority. He is responding rather to the fact -- indeed well-known to him before the Pantheismusstreit -- that rationalism's culmination in Spinozism undermines the values of Enlightenment, not only of the ancien régime. His version of Rousseau's volonté générale, the categorical imperative, relies exclusively on the authority of reason -- is completely separate from religious authority (and that much Israel concedes [cf. p. 725]). But the fact that it is based on 'duty' rather than on 'utility' -- and depends on destroying one-substance metaphysics and defending teleology (ibid.) -- is supposed to evade the Spinozist reduction of will to mere interest.

Israel concludes this volume and the trio by suggesting that "in response" to current fundamentalism, anti-secularism, postmodernism and the like, "it is at least conceivable" that the "universalism of radical thought might advance again and this time drive the wedge home harder" (p. 951). This is a noble project, and it is doubtful that any other scholar could contribute to it as much as Israel did by providing such a powerful historical framework. But in order to defend Enlightenment universalism we will need a philosophy very different from that of Spinoza.

[1] Lilti, Antoine, Le Monde des salons: sociabilité et mondanité a paris au XVIII siècle (Paris, 2005), pp. 3f.

[2] Darrin McMahon: "The Enlightenment's True Radicals," December 23rd. (This is the Internet version, for the printed piece see: "Artillery of Words," December 25, 2011, p. BR17).

[3] Nietzsche's postcard to Overbeck (July, 1881) in trans., Kaufmann, Walter, The Portable Nietzsche (New York: Penguin Books, 1976), p. 92.

[4] Waldron, Jeremy, God, Locke, and Equality: Christian Foundations in Locke's Political Thought (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2002) p. 227.