Denial, Negation, and the Forces of the Negative: Freud, Hegel, Lacan, Spitz, and Sophocles

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Wilfried Ver Eecke, Denial, Negation, and the Forces of the Negative: Freud, Hegel, Lacan, Spitz, and Sophocles, SUNY Press, 2006, 190pp, 19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0791466000.

Reviewed by Reginald Lilly, Skidmore College


In Denial, Negation, and the Forces of the Negative, Professor Ver Eecke has written a very clear, erudite study in psychoanalytic theory that draws on, principally, Hegel's philosophy to explore the Freudian conception of denial. Perhaps due to this influence, the book could well be described as an account -- replete with an extensive case study -- of the logical and anthropological possibility of self-knowledge within a psychoanalytic context, the possibility of moving from a state of denial and self-alienation to a self that is free in knowing itself as an individual.

The horizon of the book is set by the initial question it poses concerning denial and negation. It is an epistemic one, namely, how are we to distinguish denial from lying? How are we to understand denial as involving a knowledge that we have and yet we don't have? A truth that we know and simply disavow would rightfully be thought a lie. In his attempt to distance psychological denial from such a moral failure, Ver Eecke exploits the dual structure of knowing that can be found in both Freud and Hegel, a dualism that involves what one could call a propositionally explicit sense of conscious knowing and an implicit, unconscious sense of knowing.

The principal difference between lying and denial is that in the case of the former, the self is not epistemically divided against itself; the liar is fully conscious of the contradiction between what is and what is said. In denial, the self is divided such that what is unconsciously known to be true is precisely unavailable to the conscious subject who avers something untrue. In pursuit of a model of how this disjunction may be overcome and the truth be consciously known, Ver Eecke resumes a long tradition of Hegelian thought that reads the path of spirit as the movement of a self divided against itself that progressively frees itself from its self-alienating self-conceptions in a journey of self-actualization that necessarily involves the self's employing a determinate negativity with regard to its condition. This journey is, as Hegel says, one of reconciliation: reconciliation of the self with itself and with the other. The self becomes itself by finally and freely willing the circumstances of its selfhood.

In this regard, the "forces of the negative" mentioned in the book's title should be understood in an essentially Hegelian sense. The forces of the negative are, of course, spirit itself, and just as for Hegel spirit will return to itself through progressively freeing itself from all determination, so in Ver Ecke's reading of Freud, the self in denial may progressively recoup that which it has repressed and, thereby, become an individuated self. Negativity itself has negative and positive modalities: one that separates yet remains determined by what is other, and one that separates and frees itself to relate to the other: repression and its overcoming.

The first two chapters, which deal with Freud, lay out the phenomenon of denial as a matter of self-deception. Structurally, the problem is how these alienated parts of the self belong to the same self and how they may come into relation with each other such that one no longer deceives oneself but sees the truth. The theory of repression is pivotal, for it is at the origin of the self and is intimately linked to denial. As a conscious acknowledgment of a negation (repression), denial is a negation of a negation: "A denial is thus a very ambiguous performance. It undoes one crucial aspect of repression in that a denial labels the repressed. A denial lets a careful listener know precisely what the object of an effort of repression is" (13). If repression may be thought of as simple negativity, denial is the positive determination of this negativity However, as unconscious, it has not yet liberated the repressed.

But repression, most especially primary repression, reaches deeper than what is expressed in verbal denials and negations; primal repression is a negation thanks to which the self as such emerges from its libidinal attachment to the mother, and it precedes and is logically separate from denial, which is a conscious, linguistic formulation. Ver Eecke casts the problem of overcoming denial and even the singular negation of primary repression as that of bringing the non-verbal negation to consciousness: "All that falls under the power of primal repression shares this inaccessibility to consciousness. Consciousness can and should attempt to recover contents from repression, even from primal repression" (33). "If the self succeeds in the task of conquering the contents of the unconscious, it establishes a unity which it did not have for itself before. The self then inscribes an unconscious thought in a new register, that is, in consciousness" (35).

This conversion is the central moment of the Hegelian dialectic, inasmuch as the speculative understanding of negation may grasp that the propositional content of a thought extends to content determinately excluded from that thought, and it is the determinately negative connection with the excluded that enables the dialectic to work its magic of bringing what is excluded from propositional consciousness to bear on that consciousness. The conversion of negativity into positivity, and of what is repressed in denial into conscious thought is the basic operation at issue in Denial, Negation and the Forces of the Negative, and much as is the case with Hegel, for whom the advance is made when one finds a new formulation that can comprehend the expanded content, for Ver Eecke the bringing of repressed content to consciousness, too, is a matter of bringing it to language. However, the unconscious workings of the libido are considerably more complex than determinate negativity -- it is not purely logical, but idiosyncratic. The freeing of the self from its repressed libidinal investments cannot be done through logical argument, Ver Eecke tells us, but only through metaphorical work. Indeed, for Ver Eecke, metaphoricization seems to be a logician's way of speaking of the processes of displacement and condensation, unconscious operations that in this context are seen as supplements of rational thought.

In the third and fourth chapters Ver Eecke seeks to show that Freud's theory of denial or negation is not simply a psychopathological matter, but concerns human beings generally, and specifically, that denial is something inhabiting self-knowledge. The significance of this, for Ver Eecke, is that we are constantly turning away from the truth of our existence and succumbing to the allure of denial; the path toward self-knowledge proceeds not simply according to the logic of doubt, but along the "highway of despair." Indeed, where doubt is an intra-intellectual form of negation, the negation one experiences in despair carries us beyond propositional logic, bringing us to see the untruth of our self-understanding, and it is here that one must employ metaphor and symbolization in order to advance in self-knowledge.

Ver Eecke invokes Hegel's analyses of the will in The Philosophy of Right to distinguish between an arbitrary will's use of negation that mires it in an epistemic denial and a eudaemonic will that uses negation as productive of free action. In particular, he wants to show that denial has both a progressive and regressive character. As progressive, denial is an exercise of freedom -- negation and separation has a positive, practical value -- but, Ver Eecke points out, as regressive, denial makes a category error in negating an unconscious symbolic connection that in fact exists. According to Ver Eecke, the task of the therapist dealing with denial is to redirect the force of negation (freedom) to a pragmatic rather than epistemic employment and, further, to bring the epistemic into line with the emotional by finding an expression that acknowledges a loss, primally repressed, that marks the separation and emergence of the self

In the fifth and one of the most detailed chapters of Denial, Negation and the Forces of the Negative Ver Eecke examines the child's acquisition of the ability to say 'no' as indispensable for its realization of autonomy. Using R.A. Spitz's framework for analyzing child development, he first examines the stages of smiling and eight-month (separation) anxiety; after explaining Lacan's notion of the mirror stage as the moment when the six-month-old child "discovers a (bodily) unity and completeness he did not experience before" (75), but also, as an imaginary body, a moment of essential alienation, Ver Eecke offers the interesting suggestion that the mirror stage is the point at which the infant realizes that it has a body that is for others, that it can be seen and, bringing Sartre's philosophy of "the look" to bear on this stage, he avers that the dyad mother-stranger comes to represent the infant's sense of subjectivity or interiority and exteriority respectively. If to be seen means for a subject to be taken for an exteriority, managing the concomitant anxiety means to learn to detach itself from maternal intimacy and appropriate its imaginary body. As Ver Eecke writes: "Anxiety at eight months can be interpreted as a child's confession that he needs a maternal figure to be able to live with his appropriated body. The aggressive and irrational no-saying after about fifteen months of age can therefore be interpreted as the child's way of demonstrating to his mother that he has learned to live with his appropriated body and does not need his mother's support any more" (85).

In the final chapter, entitled "Denial, Metaphor, the Symbolic, and Freedom: The Ontological Dimensions of Denial," the central part is a recounting of the case of Anthony Moore, the author of Father, Son and Healing Ghosts, which tells of Moore's having lost his father to war as a young child and the odyssey of his having denied the meaning, if not the fact, of this loss. Ver Eecke's retelling of this story serves as a framework for how one is to read his book as a whole. Most schematically, by Ver Eecke's account, Moore's father died in combat during WWII when Moore, Jr., was an infant and this loss propitiated a series of events in which Moore denied and compensated for this loss of his father first by joining the Marines and then the Jesuits. Ver Eecke sees in this biography an odyssey of the negative and positive employment of the negative, an odyssey that ends with a freely individuated self. Van Eecke concludes the case of Moore by saying we must "amend" the theory of humans as rational autonomous individuals. However, it is a modest amendment that claims that rational arguments alone cannot overcome denial, but that "intergenerational connection and metaphoric work" (121) are necessary complements to argument.

It would not be an exaggeration to say that a basic premise of Ver Eecke's text is that Hegel and Freud -- or, more broadly, psychoanalysis -- are not only compatible, but that Hegel may be read as the logician or ontologist in the school of Freud. There is a long tradition of reading Hegel's oeuvre, especially the Phenomenology, as a Bildungsroman, and although Ver Eecke doesn't engage such a reading of Hegel per se, there is ample evidence that his Hegel is essentially similar. Such a Hegel fits well, for instance, with Rogerian psychology. From a more Freudian standpoint, Lacan effects an appropriation of Hegel to Freud, although the outcome is decidedly antihumanist and less amenable to Hegelian self-actualization. What is unusual in Ver Eecke's reading is that Hegel and Freud are read as pursuing the same ends and, substantially, by the same means -- the employment of negativity so as to self-actualize.

This is where readers may find Ver Eecke's coupling of Hegel and Freud more difficult to accept. There is an unmistakable optimism -- almost Kojèvian -- in Ver Eecke's reading of denial and negation, and this no doubt is due to its underlying Hegelian conceptual framework and to a reading of Hegel informed by the absolutely successful push of spirit toward its goal of self-knowledge. It cannot be disputed, of course, that repressed materials may be brought to consciousness, and that denial -- a verbal formulation of negation -- is a "hook" by which these materials can be at least partially retrieved analytically, but Ver Eecke's optimism seems not to give the force of the negative the range and effect that it might have within psychoanalysis, where its conversion to consciousness is more problematic than it is in Hegel. True, the Freud in the throes of hypno-therapy was entirely sanguine about the possibility and salutary effect of overcoming repression, but we know that his optimism quickly and increasingly radically waned. Little if any attention is given to the profound analytical and indeed meta-psychological issues familiar to Freud that such a Hegelian eudaemonism must face. It is unclear, for example, that the premises from which Ver Eecke's Hegelianized Freud proceed would be helpful or meaningful if one were to engage in a reflection on trauma theory and the various dissociative identity disorders to which early trauma may give rise. Nevertheless, there is a great deal to be learned from Ver Eecke's carefully written book.