Denken und Selbstsein: Vorlesungen über Subjektivität

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Dieter Henrich, Denken und Selbstsein: Vorlesungen über Subjektivität, Suhrkamp Verlag, 2007, 380pp., €24.80 (hbk), ISBN 9783518584811.

Reviewed by Terry Pinkard, Georgetown University



Dieter Henrich is well known in Anglophone philosophy for his historical work on German idealism (especially on Kant, Fichte, Hegel and Hölderlin). Indeed, it is safe to say that his work in that area makes him one of the great contemporary historians of philosophy. Although in the German philosophical world he is equally well known for having also put forward a systematic philosophy centered on the theme of self-consciousness, in the Anglophone world his systematic work has not attracted nearly as much attention as his historical writings have. This is unfortunate.

Henrich’s thought has always had two dimensions. First, as is shown by his path-breaking work in the development of German idealism, he is plainly drawn to the way in which philosophy has to be carried out with attention to argument and scholarly rigor. In that respect, his work is easily recognized as belonging to the kind of super-professionalized “university philosophy” that for the most part dominated philosophy in the twentieth century (and which shows no sign of letting up in the twenty-first).

However, Henrich has never been content with only that conception of philosophy. Since Plato, people have looked to philosophy for more than simply rigorous argumentation about conceptual puzzles (however deep the puzzles). They have also sought some kind of reflective engagement with the puzzles of life and thought, the results of which, if not exactly providing any kind of guide to living, at least would bring in their wake a kind of satisfaction both in thinking through the larger issues of life and in, as it were, connecting with the nature of the world as a whole. From his teacher, Gadamer, Henrich picked up on an alternative twentieth century conception of philosophy, which Gadamer himself received from his own teacher, the young Heidegger. In the first part of Being and Time, Heidegger famously argued that much of the traditional understanding of the problems of metaphysics rested on a failure to understand the non-representationalist, pragmatic structure of human activity. In the second part, he showed how that “ready-to-hand” structure of knowing one’s way around the world itself broke down in the non-propositional confrontation with one’s own finitude (as an awareness of one’s own death). That breakdown of ordinary meaning, of “knowing one’s way around the world”, provokes the agent to try to understand not just “his” own particular world but “being” as a whole. However, in light of that kind of awareness of one’s finitude, agents are provoked into a dawning awareness that any such kind of knowledge of “being” as a whole is impossible in any way that would let it seamlessly replace the ordinary pragmatic structure of knowing one’s way around the world. Against the “Greek” claims of the intelligibility of the whole (made by the idealists, Hegel among others), Heidegger argued instead for the ultimate unintelligibility of the whole. Such a mode of philosophizing, so Heidegger thought, leads not so much to a new theoretical awareness of anything but rather to a new kind of self-relation (namely, an “authentic” self-relation).

Part of the impetus for Henrich’s work in the development of German idealism was to seek a way to understand the dynamic of that development so that one could preserve the “Greek” emphasis on intelligibility and rigor (with its modern focus on meaning and truth) while at the same time bringing philosophy back to what Heidegger wanted it to be — a kind of reflection on our larger place in things that, as reflection, makes a difference to our lives, and which, in Heidegger’s terms, would lead to a deeper and more authentic self-understanding. Henrich’s starting point for his own thought remains with Kant, and one might say that Henrich has been looking for the neglected alternative in the development of German philosophy — that is, for a way of developing Kant’s insights which would not end up at either Hegel or Heidegger but which did not simply repeat Kant’s problems. Although he has laid out his ideas for this in a series of essays published over the last thirty years, he had never put them into anything like a systematic form.

Now he has. Denken und Selbstsein is published under the German literary conceit of being a series of “lectures” (the basis for the book actually was a series of lectures), and in it Henrich lays out his mature systematic views without much reference to history or to other figures. (There are no footnotes.) Roughly, Henrich’s views have their focal point in what he sees as the fundamental puzzle of subjectivity in general: to be a subject of knowledge and action is constituted by having a kind of self-knowledge, but this kind of self-knowledge does not seem to be explicable in any ordinary terms. It is not to be modeled on the subject’s awareness of any kind of object (and especially not on an awareness of a set of “inner facts” about the subject). Indeed, the subject’s self-awareness does not seem to be a two-place relation at all. Moreover, any self-ascription already presupposes an awareness of the subject to which the ascription is being made. Nor is it the case that such self-knowledge could be a practical achievement, since such an achievement would already presuppose the subject that is making the achievement. Nor could it be fully understood by analyzing the use of the word “I” (whose application already presupposes that the subject has a grasp of himself as a subject of experiences and actions). Nor is such a “subject” equivalent to a Strawsonian “person”, since the ascription of mental and physical predicates itself already presupposes the kind of subjectivity at issue. Furthermore, this self-reflexiveness of the subject means that not only does the subject know itself, it knows that it knows itself and that it does so without criteria. Self-consciousness is thus, in Kant’s terms, spontaneous; it does not have its origin in itself (it is not, as the idealists asserted, “self-positing”), nor does it seem to have its origin in anything else (one cannot analyze self-consciousness into components out of which it can be built). However, this conclusion is both theoretically and existentially unsatisfactory. We are driven to the belief that our self-consciousness must have an origin — after all, it cannot come from simply nowhere — but that origin always seems “withdrawn” from us. (In Heidegger’s terms, we are “thrown” into the world.) Clearly, there is more to be said about this, and Henrich does in fact say quite a bit more, but this is the core of his position.

The puzzling nature of self-consciousness and its fundamental character — we are, in Henrich’s terms, “conscious life”, a biological life that both stands under norms and under the conflicts among those norms without there being any adequate comprehension of the subjectivity that is so positioned — has provoked at least three different and equally inadequate ways of understanding it. There is the misguided attempt to reduce it to something material (which, although misguided, has something deeply in common with the anxiety that the very puzzle of subjectivity itself may simply be the result of a deeper illusion about ourselves - a view Henrich ascribes to Nietzsche). There is also the misguided attempt by the German idealists to offer an account of subjectivity as self-producing subjectivity that can thus give a complete account of itself. Finally, there is the attempt to see subjectivity as being constituted out of intersubjectivity; however, or so Henrich argues, we will never reach intersubjectivity without already presupposing the kind of self-knowledge that makes up subjectivity in the first place. (His disputes with Habermas on this point have been amiably contentious for a number of years.) Each of these attempts has its inspiration in the more existential longing to see how the spontaneity of self-conscious life fits into the universe as a whole, but none of them can succeed in any terms that adequately take into account the deeper puzzle of subjective, conscious life. What it is to “lead a life” and not merely to “have” a life (Henrich’s own terms) are at the core of our self-understanding.

Yet clearly conscious life is itself a part of the universe, and that universe is best explained by the natural sciences, and, just as clearly, the scientific worldview has no place in it for this kind of subjectivity. The obvious difficulty that arises out of these three clarities tends to provoke in “us moderns” a sense of there being not merely different but quite opposed orientations for our self-understandings, and thus, as Camus put it, a sense of the possible absurdity of life. It is in response to that felt sense (or anxiety) about possible absurdity that contemporary philosophical reflection derives its great motivation. The individual subject wishes to understand what is at stake in his or her life, and the incompatibility between the subjective and objective points of view place great strains on the individual’s self-understanding. (Henrich has also been a sympathetic critic of Thomas Nagel’s somewhat similar views.)

Two opposing tendencies in conscious life thus become established: Because of the way a subject’s own self-consciousness has this deep unintelligibility to itself, a dynamic is set into motion that reaches out for a comprehensive conception of the world within which the subject can understand himself. Likewise, because of the same unintelligibility of self-consciousness and because of the non-mediated kind of self-knowledge that comes with it, there is an equal dynamic for an inward turn that resists any dissolution of itself into the larger whole of the universe. (Thus, the academic disputes among philosophers about the irreducibility of subjectivity, of mental states, and about the relations between first and third-person points of view and so forth find their analogues among various ways of life that advocate absorption into something greater or focus instead on what lies within. Both are driven by the same kinds of fundamental problems.) The “outward turn” to a more comprehensive conception of the world is just as fundamental as the “inward turn” to one’s own conscious life.

That a subject strives in two directions for a comprehensive vision of the world and for the ground of his own individual subjectivity means that inevitably the agent is drawn into various conflicts among basic orientations. The tensions between subjectivity and the view of ourselves as belonging to one world — whether that one world is conceived naturalistically or in terms of a more metaphysical or religious view of the world as a totality — means that the thought that tries to comprehend how conscious life is to be conceived must, as Kant more or less understood, itself be “extrapolating”, “synthetic” and “postulating” in character. Such “extrapolating thought”, however, need not be idle speculation, nor need it or should it fall prey to the temptation to give some kind of trivializing advice about life. Rather, it must prove itself to be consistent and defensible against its alternatives; it must, that is, be “philosophical” in the stricter and not the more metaphorical sense. Where Kant went wrong was in not understanding this spontaneity as realizing itself in a “dynamic of life” set in motion by the “fact of subjectivity” itself: an organism is a “subject” that possesses self-knowledge in a “process” of life, and in humans that means it must establish a “balance among identities” as we come to terms with these competing orientations.

The dynamic that sets in motion this move to rigorous philosophical thought is further reinforced by the fact that this self-knowing subject is, as a self-knowing subject, rather formal and empty but is also at the same time an individual who co-exists with others. How are we to understand this subjective “form” that is always already individualized? That is a philosophical question, but it is also an existential question that each individual must face, a question about what the Romantic idealists liked to call (rather portentously) “the absolute”. The original Heideggerian idea that we are simply “finite” and cannot make the whole intelligible to ourselves is neither individually nor philosophically satisfying (even though there is the nagging anxiety that, after all, it may well turn out to be true). The Romantic impulse to wholeness remains, and the finite individual wishes to comprehend what kind of knowledge he or she could possibly have about whether what seems to matter in his or her own individual life “really” matters.

Clearly, for “we moderns” that issue also concerns whether we are or can be “free”. In his longest (and concluding) chapter, Henrich sketches out what he takes to be an up-to-date version of the Kantian conception of freedom. One can never have certain knowledge that one has acted freely, and one cannot observe an act of freedom as an event in the world; freedom can only be known “inwardly” — it can only be known by a subject who already understands himself as free. On the other hand, the line of thought that leads us to the conclusion that all events are caused and that we cannot be free is itself also unavoidable. Henrich spends a lot of time arguing that this seems to be both the unavoidable conclusion and explaining why it would weigh heavily against everything he has said, only to conclude that such a line of thought is going down the wrong path. Kant’s own mistake here was to see that the core element of freedom that needed explanation had to lie in our capacity to deliberate among competing grounds and thus to exercise a kind of self-causality (or causality by reason).

Henrich proposes what he thinks is a more basic sense of freedom that is not at all concerned with that kind of deliberation. What counts for individuals is their basic orientation in life, that is, their grasp of what ultimately counts and is important. Just as in all the other puzzles about subjectivity, this sets into motion a dynamic that runs in two contrary directions: towards a concern with what is important “to me” and towards a concern with what is important, full stop. Such matters of final importance take us away from our own individually vital interests and toward a concern about the “totality” that incorporates within itself the truly or objectively important. (Both religious thought and philosophy’s own orientation to “the rational” have their roots in this dynamic.) Moreover, to take up this kind of stance is in fact to develop an “ethical character”, an ability to see what is required of one in a situation without having to weigh the alternatives (or without having “one thought too many”, as Bernard Williams once famously put it). An agent with a truly ethical character in this sense thus possesses a freedom that does not consist in weighing alternatives. Indeed, he becomes an agent for whom in many cases there simply is no alternative action — it is clear what he must do — but who is nonetheless not irrationally compelled to do what he does. (Henrich compares such behavior to “speed-dialing”, a normative matter that involves no deliberation.)

This is freedom as self-determination, which Henrich takes to be an updated version of Kant’s own conception of freedom as spontaneous self-determination but without the idea of our exercising our own causality. Moreover, like Kant, Henrich claims that if we accept this account, we are led to the conclusion that we do not comprehend freedom so much as we finally comprehend its incomprehensibility. (This is Henrich’s updated version of Kant’s “fact of reason”, the idea that we always find ourselves bound to rational standards and that we cannot jump out of the space of reasons into the non-normative blue to find a ground for them. We are agents — “subjects” — precisely in finding ourselves always already within the puzzle of the “fact of reason”.) Such freedom indeed has a Schellingian ring to it: It is to be always already bound to the “basic norm” (Grundnorm) in all life, and it is manifested in the subject’s ability to give the life in which she finds herself consistency, clarity, and direction in her conscious achievements of that life. However, which basic goals of life are pursued depends not only on contingent matters such as talent, a careful weighing of alternatives and the like but also on a more fundamental setting out on a particular course of life. At the heart of his kind of freedom as “self-determination without causality coming into play” is the puzzle of the “fact” of subjectivity itself.

Henrich’s book is subtle and detailed in its examinations, and it probably goes without saying that the overview given here scarcely does it justice. The book has already appeared in French translation. One hopes that some insightful Anglophone publisher has already got the ball rolling on an English translation. Without that, a major piece of contemporary “continental” philosophy will remain for all practical purposes out of reach for us.