Depth: An Account of Scientific Explanation

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Michael Strevens, Depth: An Account of Scientific Explanation, Harvard UP, 2008, 516 pp., $59.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674031838.

Reviewed by Stephan Hartmann, Tilburg University and Jonah N. Schupbach, University of Pittsburgh



Scientific explanation and causation are two of the most enduring topics of debate in the philosophy of science. Michael Strevens’ extraordinary 500-page tome, Depth, constitutes the latest addition to both of these venerable and vital debates. Strevens identifies his book as a contribution to work on the nature of explanation; however, his theory of explanation purports to teach us important and surprising new things about causation as well. Depth thus commands the attention of today’s philosophers of science, because of the importance of these two issues, and also because of Strevens’ impressive intellectual talents.

Depth has five main parts. In what follows, we first give a brief summary of what we take to be the most important and interesting points in each of these. Then we offer two criticisms, one aimed generally at Strevens’ methodology and one aimed specifically at some of the book’s content.

In Part I (“The Causal Approach to Explanation”), Strevens makes some important preliminary clarifications and then offers an admittedly colored overview of recent accounts of explanation and high-level causation. Strevens notes that he is interested in analyzing explanation in an ontological sense, such that “explanation [is] something out in the world, a set of facts to be discovered” (p. 6). Additionally, he focuses his project so that its aim is “purely descriptive” (p. 37).

In pursuit of this project, Strevens advocates a “two-factor causal account of explanation.” That is, as opposed to giving an account of causation and positing that any causal influence on an effect e thereby is a necessary part of the full explanation for e (a “one-factor approach”), Strevens asserts that the explanation of e is only made up of those causal influences of e that pass a second test for “explanatory relevance.”1 This second factor ultimately is supposed to single out those causal influences that “make a difference” to the occurrence of e. Strevens introduces his Kairetic account to serve this purpose.

Part II (“The Kairetic Account of Explanation”) details Strevens’ account of difference-making, works this account into a fuller theory of event explanation, and then extends and applies this theory in several interesting ways. The Kairetic account attempts to extract a set of difference-makers from any veridical causal model for the explanandum event e. A veridical causal model is a set of true statements that causally entails the occurrence of e, where a set of statements causally entails that e occurs just in case the derivation of the occurrence of e from those statements "mirrors a part of the causal process by which e was produced" (p. 72). Given any veridical causal model for e then, the Kairetic account uncovers the corresponding difference-makers for e by locating the veridical causal model that is an abstraction of the original causal model2 which optimizes a set of three desiderata: generality, cohesion, and accuracy. Strevens calls any model that is the end result of this procedure an explanatory kernel for e. Additionally, he claims that any explanatory kernel for e will necessarily be made up entirely of difference-makers for e. Pertaining to explanation then, Strevens asserts that a causal model is a complete explanation of an event “just in case it is an explanatory kernel for that event … The optimizing procedure constructs standalone [complete] explanations” (p. 117). In other words, a statement may be said to explain (partially) the occurrence of an event e only if that statement is a member of some explanatory kernel for e.

Strevens then applies his Kairetic account to the causation debate through his maxim that “causal claims … are causal-explanatory claims” (p. 4). Typically, theories of causal explanation give causal claims priority over the explanatory; one discovers the explanation of e by first deciding on the high-level causes of e — i.e., those which render the statement that c caused e true. For Strevens, on the other hand, explanatory facts are prior to causal claims; statements that c caused e are shorthand for c is part of a causal explanation for the occurrence of e. With this understanding of causal claims, Strevens strives to show that many well-known puzzles and problems of causation dissolve. These include cases of preemption, cases where absences act as causes, and puzzles involving transitivity.

In Part III (“Explanation of Laws and Regularities”), Strevens shows how the Kairetic account of explanation can be made to apply to the explanations of statements of regularity (including laws). In short, where e represents any event that is an instance of the regularity in question, one explains that regularity by citing the explanatory kernel of e minus any initial conditions specific to e. Strevens calls this part of an explanatory kernel the causal mechanism and he offers the following fundamental theorem: “The explanation of a causal generalization [regularity] and the explanation of any instance of the generalization invoke the same causal mechanism” (p. 223).

Importantly, Strevens points out that, in many cases, high-level structures and patterns cited by statements of regularity (e.g., water, sexual reproduction in plants and animals on earth, Ford Pintos, etc.) are not cited by the causal mechanism appearing in the corresponding regularity explanation. In such a case, a basing generalization is necessary to make explicit the correspondence between the facts cited by the causal mechanism and those structural patterns (e.g., “All water is H2O”). There are several criteria that any such basing generalization must meet; most importantly, it must specify a relation of entanglement: F is entangled with P if "All Fs have P" is true and has sufficient scope, and if it is not true that "if such and such an object with F had not had F, it would still have had P" (p. 242). The notion of entanglement is, as Strevens points out, relatively weak insofar as it may be satisfied in the case that F is not responsible for bringing P about in any way. Lastly in Part III, Strevens uses his Kairetic account of regularity explanation to give a fascinating account of the role of idealization in science.

The Kairetic account of event explanation that Strevens develops in Part II is deterministic in the sense that any causal model under consideration must causally entail that the explanandum of interest e occurs. Thus, in Part IV (“Probabilistic Explanation”), Strevens considers the alternative case in which one may usefully give a probabilistic explanation of e. This section is far and away the most laborious for the careful reader as Strevens offers a taxonomy of probability3 and accounts for probabilistic explanation in distinct ways depending upon the type of probability involved. For reasons of space, it is impossible for this review to summarize this part in greater detail. Suffice it to say that the rewards that come out of reading these chapters make a careful read worth the effort. Two of the most interesting conclusions that Strevens defends in these chapters are: (1) The size of a probability (or of a change in probability) cited in an explanation does make a difference to the goodness of that explanation; and (2) it is often better to explain a phenomenon probabilistically than deterministically — even, in some cases, when that phenomenon is deterministically produced.

Part V (“Valediction”) is very brief, only 17 pages long. In it Strevens demonstrates some of the key points from Parts I through IV by looking at specific puzzles of explanation that arise in some of the special sciences. And, lastly, he very briefly discusses the aesthetic features of, and rewards for, successful explanation.

Now on to our objections. As noted above, in the opening sections, Strevens focuses his project in several ways. First, he is interested in accounting for explanation in an ontological sense, such that “explanation [is] something out in the world, a set of facts to be discovered” (p. 6). Strevens distinguishes this sense of explanation from the sense of explanation as a “means of communicating scientific knowledge.” Second, Strevens focuses his project so that his aim is “purely descriptive:” the goal is “to say what kinds of explanations we give and why we give them” (p. 37). In pursuing this descriptive goal, Strevens appropriately recognizes that his “most important source of evidence” is the use of explanation in scientific practice itself (p. 37). This descriptive goal is distinguished from the normative goal of evaluating explanatory practice.

These two fundamental clarifications of Strevens’ account seem, at least prima facie, to be at odds with each other. By pursuing a purely descriptive goal, one most directly connects with the sense of explanation as a means of communication; after all, a descriptive account tries to describe what is distinctive about those theories that scientists communicate as being explanatory. Similarly, when one examines actual and historical explanatory practice in the scientific literature, one directly accumulates evidence about how scientists communicate scientific knowledge. Thus, it would seem that Strevens’ descriptive goal is best achieved in terms of the concept of explanation as a communicative act. Additionally, the observation of scientific practice would seem to be a potentially odd first choice of evidence if one is interested in spelling out an ontological sense of explanation, according to which scientists can often be wrong about their explanatory claims and practices. Epistemological and logical analysis, along with strong explanatory intuitions, would seem to be a more suitable first line of evidence.

Thankfully, in the end, it seems that Strevens actually makes much wider use of explanatory intuitions and epistemological and logical analysis than he wants to admit. After all, a certain “Rasputin” thought experiment upon which he continually draws throughout the entire book is far from a historical example drawn from “the explanations regarded as scientifically adequate.” Variations of this and other case studies are intended to pump clear and useful intuitions about the concept of explanation. And Strevens shows himself to be quite capable of strong and sound philosophical analysis. This distance from purely descriptive observations of scientific practice enables Strevens to say much that is useful to the analysis of the ontological sense of explanation.

It is difficult to accept that Strevens is only attempting a descriptive account of explanatory practice for at least one more reason. Aside from observing historical accounts of explanation, there is at least one more utterly crucial source of evidence for any purely descriptive account of any human practice: psychology. While Strevens pays lip service to this line of evidence by citing it as “a possible third source of evidence” (p. 38), he actually utilizes this source only once throughout all of Depth (p. 259). Moreover, the absence of such material does not immediately present itself as a glaringly obvious defect of the book. Our suggestion is that this is because Strevens’ study differs from the purely descriptive project that he sets out in his introductory chapter.

For all of these reasons, it becomes unclear why Strevens’ account should not be interpreted as a normative analysis of explanation. He sells his account as purely descriptive but his choices of method tell otherwise. The upshot to this first objection, then, can be phrased as a dilemma for Strevens. Either he is wrong or right that his is a purely descriptive project. If the former, then Strevens’ account is actually doing something different than what he suggests. Instead of saying what kinds of explanations we do in fact give and why we give them, it is telling us what kinds of explanations we ought to give. This is only a problem insofar as Strevens is confused in his introductory chapter about the upshot of his project. On the other hand, if the latter horn of the dilemma holds true so that Strevens insists that his is a purely descriptive account, then the problem arises that he seems to be using the wrong toolbox of resources in pursuing his project. This is a far more serious problem.

A second objection: As large as Strevens’ book is, his project is much larger; consequently a lot of important details go missing and promissory notes are written. In many ways, this is a blessing. After all, 500-plus pages of dense analytical philosophy of science is enough for one book, as elegant and enjoyable as the prose may be. Also, many new interesting and promising lines of research are opened to Strevens’ devotees who desire to fill out the details wanting in Depth. But the absence of detail turns out, in some places, to be rather a curse for the theory as a whole.

In order to show this, we focus here on the absence of detail pertaining to the three central desiderata to the Kairetic account of difference-making: generality, cohesion, and accuracy. Recall that the explanation of any event or regularity is, in part, the causal model that constitutes the optimal combination of these three factors. In addition, Strevens clarifies that these desiderata can often interact and compete with one another forcing one to make tradeoffs between them (e.g., A certain causal model may not be the most accurate relative to the explanandum e, but it may still be the explanation of e if its lack of accuracy is made up for by its great generality; see section 5.2). Important questions thus immediately arise when one wants to apply the Kairetic account: What more precisely are generality, cohesion, and accuracy? How do we go about measuring the degree to which a causal model has any one of these factors (so that we can make sense of phrases like “great generality” or “very little cohesion”)? How do we go about combining and comparing these three desiderata in order to go about choosing among various candidate explanations? These are absolutely necessary questions for giving the Kairetic account substance — i.e., for being able to apply and test the Kairetic account. But Strevens unfortunately stops short of fully answering them.

Strevens does give some clarification in each case. For instance, regarding deterministic explanations, we learn at least the following: Generality has to do with the level of abstractness of a causal model; i.e., it counts the breadth of the space of possible systems for which the causal model would be veridical (p. 110). Defining cohesion is a complex and seemingly qualitative affair. Essentially, it seems for Strevens that a causal model either is or is not cohesive and that cohesion is equivalent to a notion of causal contiguity: "A model is cohesive, I propose, if its realizers constitute a contiguous set in causal similarity space, or, as I will say, when its realizers are causally contiguous" (p. 104).4 Lastly, the accuracy of a causal model with respect to explanandum e is a measure of the similarity between that model’s target (the conclusion causally entailed by the set of statements in the causal model) and the statement that e occurs (p. 142).5 However, Strevens leaves unspecified just how the Kairetic account would have us measure the degree of similarity between two statements.

Notably, none of these clarifications leave us with the answers to our previous questions that we need. Instead, we are given hints of measures, but no measures. We are given definitions that seem hopelessly complex. For the Kairetic account to be more substantive then, there is much work to be done.

And how, we may ask, will Strevens’ account fare if this work is successfully achieved? It is not clear that, if one were able to clarify the nuts and bolts of Strevens’ Kairetic account, it would not then be self-defeating. Without trying to fill out the details (after all, that would be a wildly complex affair), it seems plausible that an account like, for example, Woodward’s manipulationist account is much more general than Strevens’ account — there are fewer details needed in order to account for our explanatory practice — while being at worst only slightly less accurate. But then, if we accept Strevens’ account, it would seem quite feasible that we would be thereby obliged immediately to reject it in favor of this slightly less accurate, but more general account — given that Strevens’ account mandates accuracy/generality tradeoffs. That is, it is quite plausible that a successfully clarified version of Strevens’ account of explanation mandates its own rejection.6 Clearly then, the precise details of generality, cohesion, and accuracy very much need to be filled out, not only to give the Kairetic account more substance but also to render it defensible against this charge.

We have offered here a quick summary of Strevens’ impressive book, Depth, along with two general objections to the account of scientific explanation given therein. Neither of these objections are put forward here with the aim of attacking Strevens’ theory so much as with the aim of pointing to certain fundamental components of the theory that stand in serious need of further clarification. Moreover, our critical comments here are not meant to take away from our general endorsement of the book. Depth provides many intellectually stimulating and highly original thoughts on a number of critical and venerable philosophical topics. Any philosopher of science today will surely find it to be a rewarding read.

1 Pertaining to the nature of causation and causal influences, Strevens offers the ecumenical suggestion that most of the extant accounts of causation (including conserved quantity, counterfactual, and manipulation accounts) can accommodate the minimal assumptions about causality needed to fit our causal explanatory practice, and thus that we need not commit to a particular account of causation when analyzing explanation.

2 An abstraction of the original model: (1) only references causal influences mentioned in the original model, and (2) contains only statements that are entailed by statements contained in the original model.

3 This taxonomy as well as much of the conceptual groundwork for this section of Depth is taken from Strevens’ previous book, Bigger than Chaos (Harvard UP, 2003).

4 In order to avoid the challenge of defining and finding similarity spaces, Strevens introduces a necessary but insufficient condition for causal contiguity that acts as a test for cohesion: dynamic contiguity: "Take the trajectories corresponding to every one of a model’s concrete realizers, each a thread in state space. If this set of state space threads is contiguous, the model is dynamically contiguous" (p. 105).

5 Or, in the case that the causal model causally entails a range of possibilities, the accuracy is a measure of the similarity between the statement that e occurs and the member of this range of possibilities that is most dissimilar to e.

6 Of course, this argument that Strevens’ account may be self-defeating only holds if this account can itself be interpreted as providing an explanation of explanatory practice. This assumption seems warranted given Strevens’ descriptive aim "to say what kinds of explanations we give and why we give them" (p. 37; emphasis ours).