Descartes and the Ontology of Everyday Life

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Deborah J. Brown and Calvin G. Normore, Descartes and the Ontology of Everyday Life, Oxford University Press, 2019, 255pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198836810.

Reviewed by John Carriero, University of California, Los Angeles


The title of Deborah J. Brown and Calvin G. Normore's groundbreaking new book well describes their project. To understand what's at issue, let me start by describing the physical world according to Descartes. We begin with a fluid-like matter called extension. Extension is, of itself, homogenous. In order for diversity to appear, motion is required. With the introduction of motion, through the constant friction in the plenum, three types of matter appear: a first kind of "indeterminately small size," a second kind of "larger globules," and a third kind of "larger chunks" (p. 48). Through the arrangement and movement of these different types of matter arise the things in the world of everyday experience, including plants, animals, artifacts, planets, and stars.

All diversity in this picture, all complexity, is owed to motion and rest. We could say that all complexity is "reducible" to motion and rest. But "reducible" (which answers to Descartes's own reducere, "to lead back," which can be heard as "comes (down) to" or, in a more open-ended way, "is traceable to") can be understood in different ways. We might, very broadly, contrast two main reactions to this reduction of the inhabitants of, and goings on in, the physical world to motion and rest.

In a spirit of hard reductionism, one might think to oneself, "Well, there is a lot less to the natural world than I thought there was. It's all just matter in motion." A world one took to be teeming with life and nature (and perhaps natures) is now revealed to be cold, lifeless, dead. We used to think that living things were special, but it seems that there is not that much difference between my beloved pet and the electronic dog I picked up at Radio Shack -- a difference of complexity, perhaps, but not a difference in kind. A certain ontological flattening has ensued; the world now seems disenchanted.

In a less reductionist frame of mind, one might think to oneself, "No, the physical world is just as wonderful as I always thought it was. When I learned that my body is a fabulously complex pattern of motion and rest, what I learned was that the principles of mechanics are much richer than I had suspected." That we have arrived at a new and different understanding of the deep structure of a hurricane, rainbow, or human body doesn't detract from its reality or excellence. And if disenchantment means engaging with the physical reality in a less superstitious manner, so much the better for disenchantment. Removing the hocus-pocus from the world does not make it any less magical.

Against the grain of much recent scholarship, Brown and Normore come down squarely in the second camp. Near the beginning of their book they write:

It is sometimes claimed, and, we think, widely believed, that the scientific revolution of the seventeenth century involved the replacement among the learned of a commonsense picture of the world by a series of ever stranger pictures of what there is -- in Wilfrid Sellars' . . . pregnant terminology, a replacement of the manifest image by the scientific image. (p. 5)

This view is of a piece with what they later refer to, borrowing a phrase from Daniel Dennett, as greedy reductionism. The motto of the Greedy Reductionist is "Repeal and replace!" Against such a view, Brown and Normore argue that Descartes was not out to repeal everyday ontology and replace it with something esoteric:

A major thesis of this book is that [this replacement] was not so. First, and most important, we claim that Descartes and those who followed him did not banish the animals (human and non-), plants, artifacts, landscapes and land-arks, planets and other familiar terrestrial and celestial categories that make up the ontology of everyday life. (p. 5)

Defending this thesis requires taking up a number of difficult philosophical questions. First and foremost is how to understand the "reducible to" in the above précis. Should we adopt an eliminationist stance, so that the human body, for example, is "nothing but" or "nothing over and above" matter in motion, and not importantly different from any other region of the plenum? That is, does the reducibility of the physical world to motion and rest imply a certain ontological flattening of reality: it's all "just" matter in motion? Much of the book in one way or another is taken up with instructively exploring what "reduces" might involve (and not involve) for Descartes. A second set of questions concerns how this picture fits with traditional substance-accident (or substance-mode) ontology: what counts as substance in this picture? The plenum? The pieces of the plenum? The particles? The complex structures found in the plenum? Since Descartes styles animals as automata, another set of issues concerns what an automaton is for Descartes, and how automata differ from other composite structures. And, again, in view of the relation of animals to automata, how does Descartes understand life? That is, how do living mechanisms differ from the nonliving ones? What sort of significance does the distinction now hold -- e.g., will life still seem special, on this picture?

These questions are of interest in their own right as well as for gauging Descartes's attitude toward them. In order to address them the authors have had to provide a sustained treatment of something that Descartes himself did not provide a sustained treatment of. That Descartes did not do so doesn't make Brown and Normore's project any less important or interesting, but it does make it more difficult. They have had to assemble clues scattered about in different texts. More impressively, they have reflected seriously on what Descartes's scientific practice implies about his stance toward these issues. Especially noteworthy here is the use they make of Descartes's account of embryogenesis and of the role of the heart and blood in sustaining life.

In brief, Brown and Normore have executed their daunting project -- the product of many years of thought -- to a very high philosophical and scholarly standard. It reflects an encyclopedic knowledge of primary sources, reaching across the early modern period and back through medieval philosophy all the way to antiquity. Their knowledge of primary sources is complemented by a state-of-the-art command of the secondary literature. Their assessments are consistently made with care, judiciousness, and clarity. All in all, a virtuoso performance.

In the first chapter, "The World as Descartes Found It," Brown and Normore provide a sketch of the Aristotelian world and treatments of the distinctions between substance and mode, and between form and matter. The discussion draws from a greater variety of sources than usual. Thus, it lays the groundwork for their view that Descartes was in dialogue with "a complex family of philosophies" (p. 5), as opposed to, say, simply responding to a monolithic Aristotelianism.

In the second chapter, on bodies, Brown and Normore argue that Descartes took at least some finite bodies to be individual substances. In particular, they maintain that "any quantity of matter, even if its parts were widely distributed" can count as "one extended substance" and yields one sense of "body" in Descartes's writings (p. 39). To get to the sense of "body" that is relevant for everyday things, however, much more structure must be introduced and provision must be made for change in the underlying quantities of matter that constitute the body. In particular, paradigmatic examples of ordinary things -- automata, plants, animals -- have (or better are) what Descartes call true and immutable natures; that they are true and immutable natures confers upon them the status of being entia per se (or una per se), as opposed to being mere aggregates.

One class of bodies that Descartes is particularly interested in is automata; the third chapter is devoted to an account of them, and in particular to the special way in which they are self-movers. Building on the more or less contemporaneous writings of Kenelm Digby, Brown and Normore propose four main criteria for being an automaton: (i) heterogeneity of parts and motions, (ii) hierarchical organization and interdependence of parts, (iii) indivisibility, and (iv) emergence of activities that belong to the whole (p. 75). They canvas various types of composition discussed by Descartes, and present an insightful discussion of why Descartes is confident that, on the one hand, the nonrational activity of animals is fundamentally mechanical and, on the other hand, rational activity is not.

The fourth chapter explores Descartes's account of animals and their functioning, and details the path he took between hard reductionism and teleology. Brown and Normore argue that Descartes's scientific practice fits well with a modern pluralism that allows for different levels of analysis. Section 4.3, "Skyhooks and Cranes" (these expressions are also borrowed from Dennett), is especially important for understanding their point of view. They go on to explain how, for Descartes, systems such as animals have functions without those functions being teleological. Brown and Normore use the question of whether a system acts "for the sake" of a result of its actions as a gauge for whether the result of the operation is an "end," and, correspondingly, whether the operation itself is teleological. They argue that while the notion of function cannot be eliminated from Descartes's account of animals, functions for him are not for the sake of ends and so are not teleological. Along the way, they discern what they call the principle of reciprocal dependence at work in some of Descartes's writings, which they argue can help settle certain issues concerning an organism's boundary.

The fifth chapter pursues questions of life (and death). What sort of distinction did Descartes see between nonliving and living things? Brown and Normore survey various suggestions as to how he might draw this line and find them all wanting. They argue that Descartes's account of the role that the heart and blood play in his theory of nutrition reveals a characteristic feature of an important class of living beings, i.e., warm-blooded animals, but leaves unclear his views about bloodless creatures or how to fit in plants, which Descartes calls living (although with how much commitment is unclear). In the face of this, they cautiously conclude that "'life' as a concept is, for Descartes, equivocal or vague" (p. 163). This conclusion is informed, in part, by their analysis in the previous chapter of function in terms of reciprocal dependence.

In the sixth chapter Brown and Normore turn to Descartes's account of the human being. Descartes holds that a human being is an ens per se, which many have taken to imply that he thinks that a human being is substance. They disagree. In their view, the mind's union with the body affords it a unique perspective on the world. This perspective enriches the self in certain important respects -- it brings about an "embodied" thinker, a "whole" self, as opposed to a "minimal" self, i.e., the "mind alone" that is under investigation in the Second Meditation. But, drawing on how an unio substantialis was understood in the connection of late scholastic theories of the Trinity, Brown and Normore argue that Descartes's claim that there is a substantial union between the mind and the body does not commit him to the view that the human being resulting from the union is itself a substance.

In the seventh chapter, in a more speculative vein, they turn from the union of the mind and body to consider what Descartes would have made of larger, interpersonal unions, "from couples to armies" and including "the formation of political unions such as cities and empires" (p. 182). Since the will and the passion of love play a crucial role in such unions, the chapter begins with a detailed discussion of free will in Descartes. This discussion, which is of independent interest, concludes that for Descartes "there is nothing that we can conceive that we cannot will; though naturally oriented toward the objective good, we are not slaves to it."

Brown and Normore's book is a wonderful journey through this important and difficult terrain. The project is of obvious importance not only for understanding Descartes but also for getting a feel for the status quo ante, as subsequent thinkers took up these questions. Let me conclude with some thoughts on how their work opens up a dialogue between Descartes and his rationalist successors, Spinoza and Leibniz.

While Descartes left the status of life unsettled -- "'life' as a concept is, for Descartes, equivocal or vague" (p. 163) -- Spinoza and Leibniz have more systematic things (albeit in the context of very different systems) to say about the difference between living and nonliving. Spinoza claims that all things are animate (Ethics, 2p13); moreover, what he says about the formation of complex bodies out of less complex bodies in the Physical Digression (which is found between 2p13 and 2p14 in the Ethics) and what he says about parts and wholes in Letter 32 (his examples are lymph and chyle particles in the blood) may profitably be related to Brown and Normore's idea of different levels of analysis. In addition, a notion of reciprocal dependence is clearly in play in Letter 32 (although it is not clear that this is quite the same notion that Brown and Normore find in Descartes). Leibniz, for his part, maintains that there is an important (in kind?) difference between artificial machines and natural (living) machines: according to him, the hierarchical analysis that Brown and Normore see as partially constitutive of being an automaton terminates in the case of artificial machines (although there are of course other kinds of infinite complexity beneath the bottom level of the hierarchy), but continues without end in the case of a living or natural machine.

A more central preoccupation of Spinoza and Leibniz is what to make of the category of substance in the context of the emerging new picture(s) of the physical world in the seventeenth century. Neither Spinoza nor Leibniz would have been happy with a substance composed of metaphysically prior parts, although they take dramatically different paths at this point. Spinoza holds that the entirety of extension is prior to its finite regions in roughly the way that one might think that the whole of space is prior to any of its finite descriptions. (From what I can tell, Spinoza may well have read Descartes in that way -- see, e.g., Ethics, 1p15s.) By way of contrast, Leibniz seems to have drawn the moral that substances are nowhere to be found at the level of pure extension but inhabit a more fundamental level of reality. For Leibniz, no mere aggregate is a substance. Further, if a mere aggregate is to involve reality, it must be grounded in the fundamental level of substance, which is why Leibniz takes aggregates to be ultimately aggregates of substances.

Spinoza and Leibniz agree that the theory of substance does not exhaust what there is to be said about reality. One might ask, then, what would they have made of at least some of the items of everyday life discussed by Brown and Normore?

To begin with Spinoza, recall where Descartes leaves things, on Brown and Normore's account. The entia per se that add irreducible reality to the physical world have (or are) true and immutable natures. These beings are not themselves finite substances; finite physical substances are simply fixed collections of quantities of matter. Natural automata, which include animals, are constantly gaining and losing their individual quantities of matter. Thus, Brown and Normore write that living things "cannot, for Descartes, be substances although they may be composed of them; they are automata that emerge as the result of interactions among extended substances according to the laws of motion and impact" (p. 137). Even "composed" must be handled carefully: perhaps each automaton is in some sense "composed" of the collection of quantities that make up its body at a given moment; but what matters is not so much the quantities of matter themselves as how they are structured through the introduction of motion, and the motions themselves (if critical motions cease, we no longer have an animal but a corpse).

The entity that emerges thus through the interactions of the quantities of matter seems to hover above the ontological level of substance: it seems to be a pattern that persists as the matter underneath continually shifts. It is not too hard to view such a being as what Spinoza terms a ratio of motion and rest. And if what Bucephalus is is a ratio or a stable pattern in a plenum, whose quantities of matter are continually shifting beneath him, then it seems not unreasonable to think of him as a modification. Not that he is a modification of the collection of the quantities of matter that happen to constitute him at any given instant, whatever that might mean. Rather, the ratio that he is would seem to be a local part of an overarching global pattern of motion and rest, which modifies the entire collection of the quantities of matter that constitute res extensa. (This collection, whose membership is fixed, would count as a substance even on Descartes's view, as presented by Brown and Normore.) One might see in all of this, then, a possible route to Spinoza's view that finite bodies are parts of the face of the whole universe, which face is in turn an infinite modification of extension -- even if, as Brown and Normore suggest (see p. 51, n. 34, and p. 30), this is not a path that Descartes found philosophically attractive.

Leibniz takes a very different course. Some inhabitants of ordinary life, like Bucephalus, turn out to be corporeal substances (at least in some periods of Leibniz's thought). Other ordinary things are mere aggregates. Of these, some (like a herd of sheep) fail to qualify as automata; others (like an artificial machine) do. But while a mere aggregate may witness the presence of some special reality in the world (and I'm inclined to think that at least some do for Leibniz), no mere aggregate (automaton or not) is an ens per se; whether Leibniz thinks a mere aggregate can have a true and immutable nature is unclear to me.

There is a lot more to be said about what Spinoza and Leibniz might have made of the Descartes that emerges from this book. It seems to me that not the least virtue of Brown and Normore's original and pathbreaking book is to make possible such philosophical conversations between Descartes and later thinkers who took up in more systematic ways topics like the nature of life and the nature and status of the finite things that enrich our world.