Descartes and the Passionate Mind

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Deborah J. Brown, Descartes and the Passionate Mind, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 231pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521857287.

Reviewed by Lisa Shapiro, Simon Fraser University


We philosophers have been reared on a story of Descartes as a champion of epistemology and metaphysics. According to this story, Descartes was principally concerned with achieving certain knowledge. His philosophical project thus centered on the intellect and on getting clear on the ontology undergirding its grasp of the truth. But of course, like any story, this one left a lot out, and shifts of scholarly focus over the past two decades or so have woven other storylines into the account. Two stand out. The first shift in focus on Descartes highlighted his concern with the body over that of the mind. Descartes's natural philosophy, his account of the material world rather than the intellectual one, played an important role in the development of the mechanistic physics that gained sway in the early modern period. More recently, there has been another new point of focus: Descartes's conception of the human being -- the union of mind and body. This point of view interweaves the first two concerns. For it starts from the challenge of understanding the human capacity for thought in the face of a natural world conceived mechanistically. Human beings do think, understand and have knowledge; we have minds. But we are no angels: we have two feet squarely planted on the ground; we are embodied. And bodies, as parts of nature, are like machines. Descartes's question, and ours both in understanding him and in wrestling with a similar question in contemporary philosophy, is how to reconcile human mindedness with human embodiedness. There are two natural places to look for Descartes's answer to this question: the Sixth Meditation and his last work, The Passions of the Soul. In addition, the correspondence between Descartes and Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia is an invaluable resource. Because of the content of these writings, this focus also bears on recent interest in the cognitive dimensions of emotions evidenced both in historical work and contemporary philosophy of mind. Deborah Brown's book fits into this discussion along two dimensions. First, she wants to bring these writings to bear on problems in Descartes's philosophy of mind. Second, she offers us an account of Descartes's account of action.  These two dimensions are related, for, in her view, the key to understanding Descartes's account of an embodied human mind is understanding what she terms his phenomenal monism -- our experience of the unity of mind and body -- and the way this experience is essential to "our practical and theoretical enterprises."

The book begins with some stage setting from the perspective of Descartes's own writings and the broader historical philosophical context. Chapter 1 aims to provide an overview of the Cartesian texts relevant for wrestling with the problem of the Cartesian embodied mind and its relation to Cartesian dualism. Brown provides a summary of Descartes's remarks on the mind-body union and views on ethics and the regulation of the passions in his correspondence with Elisabeth. She then presents a reading of the Passions of the Soul as an extension of the Meditations to the practical sphere. In Chapter 2 Brown reviews the intellectual historical background to Descartes's discussion of the passions, including a brief overview of Stoicsim, Galenic physiology, Avicenna's account of the vis estimativa, and Scholastic taxonomies based on the formal objects of the passions.

The core of Brown's account of Descartes's phenomenological monism and its import for our understanding of his philosophy of mind comes in Chapters 3, 4, and 5. In Chapter 3, Brown aims to present her reading of Descartes as a phenomenological monist. That is, she wants to understand how the mental functions of sensation and passion serve to ground an embodied rationality which itself grounds rational action. The account bears the obvious burden of accommodating Descartes's dualism, wherein the mind, as a substance independent from body, can reason all on its own. Brown argues that in the case of sensations and passions Descartes is best read as distinguishing representational content from phenomenal content. If I have understood the reading correctly, while representational content is a matter for the intellect, embodied rationality is rooted in the phenomenal content of our body-caused thoughts. This phenomenal content has a distinct functional role: moving us to action. This role is achieved in part by the sense of our location in the world afforded by sensations.  Descartes's phenomenological monism, then, lies in the phenomenal content of our sensations and passions.

In Chapter 4, Brown pivots her discussion on the fulcrum of the interpretive questions surrounding the notion of material falsity Descartes introduces in the Third Meditation as a matter of representing a non-thing as if it were a thing. Key to understanding this puzzling notion is Descartes's account of mental representation. Brown offers an account of the representationality of body-caused thoughts by drawing on the notion of referring Descartes employs in his discussion of both sensations and passions in the Passions of the Soul. The passions, according to Brown, "represent the soul as affected in a certain way by some external thing" (103). They are both perceptions of good and evil of certain things and wantings that things be a certain way. Insofar as they represent these wantings, the passions move us to action. Because the passions involve experiencing the soul as moved, we cannot be wrong about them: we are moved, and cannot be wrong that we are moved in the way we are. And so, in Brown's view, passions cannot represent things as non-things, and so cannot be materially false; the notion applies only to sensations. Brown goes on, using a referring-based account of sensory representation, to offer an account of how sensations are materially false. Much of the success of Brown's argument hangs on how her account of representationality of the passions maps on to the representational content/phenomenal content distinction of the previous chapter. Perhaps the passions cannot be materially false in their phenomenal content, but what about their representational content? Can they not represent something as good (or bad) which is not valuable at all? Would this count as representing a non-thing as a thing? These questions are not addressed. Equally, it seems clear that some sensory perceptions also move us to action -- we want to drink when we are thirsty and eat when we are hungry. Are these internal sensations, as Descartes sometimes calls them, also not materially false for the reason that Brown argues the passions are not? Or would Brown want to claim that they are sensations associated with desires, which are passions?

In Chapter 5, Brown tackles the problem of the metaphysical status of the Cartesian human being -- a union of mind and body -- in the face of Descartes's dualism. Brown approaches this question from the claim in the very first article of the Passions that "the action and the passion do not cease to be always one and the same thing which has two names on account of the two different subjects to which one can refer it." (11:328) Brown argues that this claim does not entail that bodily states (actions) and mental states (passions) are numerically identical, although they might not be really distinct. In Brown's view, the Cartesian human being manifests an ontological dependence of mind and body without yet making of them a single substance.  Furthermore, this ontological dependence is a proper causal one, and not merely occasionalist. The argument against Paul Hoffman's notion of straddling modes, buttressing his view that the human being is a substance, is an interesting one. What is not clear is whether, in Brown's view, there is more to the mind-body union than their causal connection.

The remainder of the book turns to the broadly ethical concerns, the action-orientation that Brown takes to be the key to understanding Descartes's account. In Chapter 6, Brown aims to reexamine the Cartesian epistemic agent from the perspective of the whole human being, rather than that of the pure intellect dominating the Meditations. The focus here is on wonder, the first of all the passions, and that which, when properly modulated, moves us toward science and learning. Brown also considers how love moves us to join our own interests with those of others.

Chapter 7, as the title announces, focuses on 'several strange passages on desire and fortune'. Brown reads Descartes through the lens of a belief-desire psychology, and from that point of view wants to understand how we as agents reason about practical matters, that is, about how to act. Central concerns are the role of thinking of divine providence in decision-making, the standard of correct practical judgment, and the role of avoiding regret in decision-making. In the last instance, Brown attempts to bring contemporary decision theory about regret to bear on Descartes's account. I have more to say about this chapter below.

Chapter 8, the last chapter, concerns generosity -- for Descartes, legitimate self-esteem consisting of the knowledge that we have a free will and the resolve to use that will well -- and its role in the regulation of the passions.

There are many details of Brown's discussion that I would want to take issue with, but I do not intend to catalog these here. Rather, I want to focus my critical attention on her account of Descartes on the regulation of the passions in Chapter 7.

As Brown presents it, Descartes's account of the regulation of the passions is a matter of the regulation of desires, and desires, as passions, are, well, passive. How, she puzzles, are we supposed to regulate something that, insofar as it is passive, does not depend on us? Brown's answer to this question is ingenious, but I think misguided. Brown argues that we can regulate our desires by seeking to maximize our happiness, and that central to doing so is minimizing regret. Being resolved to do what we have decided to do provides just the right sort of self-satisfaction to balance any regrets we might have when things did not turn out as we had intended. Regulating our desires is thus essentially part of a decision theoretical calculus designed to maximize our happiness. While some might maintain that this sort of interpretation is anachronistic, I don't think that is quite fair. Hobbes, after all, is a contemporary of Descartes (and the author of the Third Set of Objections), and we do take the problem of emerging from a Hobbesian state of nature to be akin to the Prisoner's Dilemma. Moreover, I do think that this kind of argument might have gone a long way to assuage Elisabeth's skepticism about our ability to avoid regret.  For Elisabeth, our lack of a perfect knowledge of goods ('an infinite science') entails that we will get stuck trying to arbitrate between competing perspectives. Who is right: the naturally arrogant or the naturally timid person? And if we manage to get beyond that, given that nothing ever works out perfectly, we can always second guess whether we did the right thing. By focusing on the value of happiness, and of the resolve to increasing happiness, Descartes might have been able to show her that it is only rational (in the sense of promoting the end of happiness) to avoid regret. The problem for Brown's account is that Descartes does not do that. Descartes's replies to Elisabeth show considerations about regret to be part of a conclusion of an argument rather than a premise in it. For him, we ought not to regret our actions because we know that in acting we used our reason well; we judged the best we could. Avoiding regret is not part of our judging well; it is a natural outcome of recognizing that we have judged well (or at least as well as we could). As he writes in his letter to Elisabeth of 18 August 1645, "true happiness is not the sovereign good; but it presupposes it, and it is the contentment or satisfaction of the mind that comes from possessing it" (4:275). As he puts it later in the same letter, contentment is the prize, and while the prize might motivate us to enter the contest in the first place, it is not test of the competition.  Rather, as Descartes repeatedly maintains, virtue is sovereign good. And for him, that virtue is simply the resolution to do what we judge to be the best (or to use our will well) is important to understanding this point. It is a peculiar feature of this account that we do not actually need to do well in order to be virtuous; we need simply to try to do well. Clearly, we still need to understand what it is to do well (or to try to) for Descartes and how doing so brings about happiness. We also need to clarify just how this account of virtue centered on our free will is consistent with the naturalistic dimension of Cartesian ethics Brown rightly draws attention to.

Brown's work is a contribution to the existing literature, especially to the recent strand focused on Descartes's views on the mind-body union. While there has been no small interest of late in Descartes's Passions of the Soul, scholars have not settled on a framework with which to approach the work. Diving into the discussion is no small endeavor. Of particular interest is Brown's suggestion that we think of Cartesian thought as essentially action-oriented.