Descartes and the Puzzle of Sensory Representation

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Raffaella De Rosa, Descartes and the Puzzle of Sensory Representation, Oxford UP, 2010, 190 pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199570379.

Reviewed by David Clemenson, University of St. Thomas (Minnesota)



The fundamental principle of [the modern, anti-Aristotelian] philosophy is the opinion concerning colours, sounds, tastes, smells, heat and cold; which it asserts to be nothing but impressions in the mind, deriv’d from the operation of external objects, and without any resemblance to the qualities of the objects (David Hume, Treatise on Human Nature, bk. I, pt. 4, sec. 4).

If Hume were alive today he might be disappointed to find that this “fundamental principle” is not the center of attention of twenty-first century historians of early modern philosophy. But the precise content of this principle is surprisingly difficult to determine. The major early moderns wrote few ex professo works on sensation and sensory qualities (Berkeley’s An Essay Towards a New Theory of Vision is a notable exception). As a rule, their views must be pieced together from isolated passages in diverse publications, private papers, and letters. In most cases, these passages are not easily reduced to a clear and coherent doctrine.

This is certainly true of Descartes’ diverse remarks on sensation. Anyone hoping to distill a unified doctrine from these remarks must first determine what he understood by sensus (Latin for “sensation” — though it can also mean “sense faculty”). According to the Meditations’ Sixth Set of Replies (AT VII 436-38), there are at least three distinct meanings that the word may bear. First-level “sensation” is the purely corporeal action of the environment on the body’s sense organs, culminating in certain processes or states in the brain; such “sensations” do not involve consciousness, and even non-rational animals have them. At the opposite extreme, third-level “sensations” include all habitual (and commonly unnoticed) judgments — acts of pure intellect — that are occasioned by the relevant sensory brain-state (these include judgments concerning external bodies’ size and distance occasioned by the brain-states that cause visual sensations). But the only thoughts that we should attribute to the sense faculty, “should we wish to distinguish it accurately from the intellect” ("nihil aliud ad sensum referendum, si accurate illum ab intellectu distinguere vellemus", ibid., 437), are second-level sensations, the mental modes that “immediately result” from the mind’s union with the body. For Descartes, application of the term sensus to the processes, states, or acts of the first or third level — e.g., the habitual and unnoticed “visual perceptual” judgments concerning the size and distance of external bodies — is merely a concession to common usage (a concession Descartes is typically very willing to make, as long as there is no pressing need for greater accuracy). For the rest of this review, the word ‘sensation’ will be taken to mean “second-level sensation,” unless otherwise noted.

It used to be assumed that Descartes considered sensations to intentionally represent nothing outside the mind (few readers will require the reminder that in the philosophy of mind “intentional” and its cognates normally designate not volition, but the attribute of thoughts in virtue of which they have an object or content). This is how he was read by early Cartesians such as Malebranche. I will call this “the received interpretation” (“RI”). According to RI, Descartes took sensations to be more or less reliable signals of certain conditions in the environment, but did not think that they themselves made these conditions present to (or in) the mind, and so did not count them as intentional representations (or intentional misrepresentations) of such conditions. For him, only concepts were intentional representations of this kind.

Over the past twenty years, RI has been challenged by several prominent commentators, for whom Descartes took sensations, as well as concepts, to be capable of intentionally representing (or misrepresenting) certain aspects of the external world. Raffaella De Rosa’s Descartes and the Puzzle of Sensory Representation is at once a critique and an endorsement of this new, “anti-RI” line of interpretation. At least a third of the book is an attack on the views of some of its best-known representatives, especially Margaret Wilson, Tad Schmaltz, and Alison Simmons (the views of Martha Bolton, Andrew Pessin, and Paul Hoffman are also considered, but in less detail). Yet De Rosa agrees with them in rejecting RI. She sets forth a novel anti-RI interpretation, which she calls “descriptivist-causal” (hereafter, “DCI”), designed to capture the strengths of earlier anti-RI readings while avoiding their defects. Limitations of space prevent me from commenting on De Rosa’s critique of competing anti-RI interpretations. This review is restricted to a summary and brief critique of DCI.

According to DCI, sensations of colors, sounds, etc., in Descartes’ philosophy (henceforth, “Cartesian sensations”), are, pace RI, intentional (mis)representations of the extramental environment. But sensory representation of these features does not consist in being normally caused or occasioned by those features, pace Wilson and Schmaltz (ch. 3), or in serving as a reliable sign of environmental conditions tending to promote or hinder the survival of the mind-body union, pace Simmons (ch. 4). Instead, it consists in the sensation’s containing innate concepts of extension and its modes. Since all such concepts are intentional representations of actual or possible extension or extension-modes, Cartesian sensations contain intentional representations of such items (pp. 145, 172, and passim). But for DCI Cartesian sensations misrepresent the nature of matter, by mingling the clear and distinct idea of extension with an obscure and confused qualitative content (pp. 43-44 and passim).

More precisely, Cartesian sensations are ideas, and as such have “both a presentational and referential content” (pp. 32, 143) — the latter being the intentionally represented object (whether actual or merely possible), and the former being the way in which that object is represented. A Cartesian sensation’s presentational content is two-fold, comprising (a) the presentational content of the sensation’s constituent concepts and (b) the aforementioned phenomenal aspects. Because these phenomenal aspects are not the presentational content of any concept, they cannot serve as a way of representing things as they really are (only concepts can do that, p. 32). It is the presence, within the sensation’s presentational content, of these phenomenal aspects that constitutes the sensation as capable of misrepresenting an actual or possible extramental object. On the other hand, because the sensation’s presentational content also contains non-phenomenal aspects, namely, the presentational content of the concepts contained within the sensation, the sensation does succeed in representing something outside the mind. The presentational content of a concept is not phenomenal or qualitative, and does not consist in any likeness to the represented object (p. 176). Rather, it consists in being a description that is satisfied by that object (pp. 2, 18-19). The object satisfies this descriptive aspect of the sensation "only after a (reflective) process of clarification and analysis of the confused sensory content" (p. 123), however.

In sum, sensory representation has both an innate “descriptive” dimension, in virtue of which it succeeds in referring (via correct description) to the true nature of matter and its modes, and a “causal” (or externally caused) dimension, the phenomenal qualia that arise solely because of the body’s action on the mind, and that intentionally represent nothing extramental. From the standpoint of DCI, RI correctly identifies the second of these dimensions, but overlooks the first, while the non-traditional readings advocated by Wilson, Schmaltz, and Simmons give the first dimension its due, but neglect the second. Only a descriptivist-causal interpretation can do justice to both.

These considerations, De Rosa claims, suffice to solve an old puzzle, mentioned in the title of her book, that was posed for Descartes by Arnauld in the Fourth Set of Objections to the Meditations. Noting that for Descartes an idea of x is just x itself (in the “objective” mode of being proper to objects of awareness; cf. the Third Meditation, and the First Set of Replies), and so must possess all the characteristics of x, Arnauld concluded that no Cartesian sensory idea (and a fortiori no other Cartesian idea) can represent its object as other than it is (cf. pp. 28-30, 152-60) — contrary to what Arnauld took Descartes to be saying in certain passages in the Third Meditation. De Rosa solves the puzzle by attributing to Arnauld the mistake she takes to be characteristic of RI: Arnauld has noted only the descriptivist dimension of sensations, while overlooking the causal or phenomenal element that alone makes it possible for these ideas to misrepresent their objects. In so doing he has in effect confused sensations with clear and distinct innate concepts, which alone are incapable of intentional misrepresentation.

This completes the summary of what I take to be the main points of De Rosa’s DCI. Some critical observations follow.

(1) DCI is distinguished from other anti-RI readings of Cartesian sensation theory mainly by its claim that sensation has a (partly) conceptual character. But more must be said about what this conceptual character amounts to. Since (as noted in the description of Arnauld’s “puzzle”) Descartes speaks of concepts as identical to what they represent — the idea of the sun, he says, is the sun (not qua in the sky, but qua in the mind) — are we to assume that the description that for DCI constitutes the presentational content of a concept of x is simply x itself, qua in the mind? If so, since identity to x entails resemblance to x, why deny, as DCI does, that descriptions resemble the thing described? Furthermore, if concepts are identical to the thing described, how does the concept’s presentational content differ from its referential content? Is not the referential content of an idea of x also x qua in the mind? A fuller account of such points seems required.

(2) The passage from the Sixth Set of Replies cited at the outset of this review is of course well known to De Rosa. She seems to take it to imply that bodies are intentionally represented by second-level sensations, inasmuch as such judgments are there said (she claims) to result from second-level sensations (p. 50; cf. p. 47, where a similar claim is made about AT VIII-1 32). But the relevant passage, "ex isto coloris sensu, quo afficior, judicem [corpus], extra me positum, esse coloratum" (AT VII 437, ll. 25-27) does not obviously imply that our erroneous judgments attributing colors to bodies result from any intentional representation by sensation of bodies as colored. Nor (pace pp. 47-48) is any such implication evident in the Sixth Meditation and Principles I.66-74, which treat at length the question of why we make (erroneous) judgments of this kind. On the contrary, Principles I.66 states that the source of these errors lies in allowing our judgments to include more than what is “strictly contained in our perception” (CSM 2: 216; AT VIII-1 32). This suggests that the “strict content” of sensation excludes intentional misrepresentation of conditions in the environment. All this casts doubt on the claim (p. 62) that Descartes’ remarks on the origin of erroneous judgments attributing colors, etc. to bodies are better explained by DCI than by RI.

(3) The Sixth Set of Replies passage does not directly refute De Rosa’s claim that second-level sensations are or include an intentional representation. But since (as I noted earlier) Descartes is quite happy to “speak with the vulgar,” whenever he thinks that the context makes his meaning clear enough, it does raise the possibility that an undetermined proportion of the texts cited in her book as implying the concept-ladenness of second-level sensations refer instead to “sensations” in the third-level sense — in which case it is uncertain (pending further clarification) which of these texts, if any, give reason for preferring DCI to RI.

(4) De Rosa (p. 48) takes the following passage from Principles I.70 to entail that sensations are intentional representations:

when we say that we perceive colours in objects, this is really just the same as saying that we perceive something in the objects whose nature we do not know, but which produces in us a certain very clear and vivid sensation which we call the sensation of colour (CSM 1: 218; AT VIII-1 34).

But such an entailment is far from clear, since Descartes does not say that the claim “we perceive colours in objects” is true, and since “perceive” cannot always be assumed to mean “have a sensation that intentionally represents” (it can designate third-level “sensations,” which for Descartes are not sensations sensu stricto).

(5) If Cartesian sensations are normally misrepresentations then Descartes would seem to be committed to the view that God is a deceiver, hence imperfect, hence not God. Although some imaginations are voluntary (in the sense that the mind’s volition causes or occasions, via the mind-body union, a brain-state that is the immediate cause of the desired image), no sensation is voluntary. One who is forced by nature — hence, by nature’s author, God — to have intentional representations that exhibit extension as having characteristics that it cannot have, must, it seems, be considered the victim of divine deception. True, God has given us an intellect by which we may discover our second-level sensations to be misrepresentations (cf. p. 75), but even a discovered misrepresentation is still a misrepresentation. For the reasons just given, it is not easy to see how such misrepresentations as DCI takes sensations to be can fail to count as deceptions perpetrated by God. One might reply that, nevertheless, Descartes must have thought of sensations as deceptive in this way, since he calls them “materially false” in the Third Meditation, the Fourth Set of Replies, and the Conversation with Burman (cf. pp. 43, 56­-57). This brings me to my next point.

(6) According to De Rosa (p. 56) the strongest evidence against RI is provided by the material falsity passages just mentioned. But these passages need not be read as ascribing intentional misrepresentation to second-level sensation; see, for example, the analysis in Richard Field’s 1993 Philosophical Review article, or pp. 85-91 of my 2007 book (reviewed in NDPR by Dan Kaufman). Since De Rosa does not argue for the superiority of her own reading to these alternatives, which do not contradict RI, her argument (pp. 56-60) that these passages refute RI must be judged inconclusive. For the same reason, the material falsity passages do not obviously establish the deceptiveness of Cartesian sensations (cf. the immediately preceding point 5).

(7) Even if De Rosa’s arguments on pp. 54-55 and 60-66 established that Cartesian sensations are intentional representations, this would not show that they intentionally represent actual or possible extramental objects; sensations might instead be (confused) intentional representations of mental modes (e.g., themselves), and intentionally represent nothing extramental. This would be consistent with RI, as it was defined above, but not with DCI. De Rosa argues against such a view of Cartesian sensations as representations of mental modes (which she attributes to Alan Nelson) on pp. 51-53, but her arguments here are unconvincing. First we are told (p. 52) that it is “just a fact” that sensations "present themselves as if of objects." While Descartes can safely be assumed to have held such a view of third-level “sensations,” it is less clear that he held such a view of sensations in the strict, second-level sense. But even if he did, how do we know that he did not take sensations’ intentionally represented objects to be mental modes (e.g. themselves)? Next (ibid.), De Rosa appears to say that Descartes’ “doctrine of the transparency of thought” entails that no sensation can intentionally represent itself. But because she does not define this doctrine, it is impossible to judge the soundness of her argument. Finally, she implies (ibid.) that Cartesian sensations cannot intentionally represent themselves, inasmuch as they are not ideas of reflection. But if “ideas of reflection” are voluntary ideas that intentionally represent some other (modally distinct) idea, then Cartesian sensations, which are involuntary, are by definition not ideas of reflection. Whether they intentionally represent themselves is a separate question. (There is evidence that for Descartes every thought is or includes an intentional representation of itself; cf. AT VII, 559.)

(8) On pp. 42-44 De Rosa argues against the soundness of a particular argument in support of RI, which she labels “(KI)” (for “the key inference”). (KI) runs as follows: "There are no real properties of bodies that resemble the sensation of color and the like, according to Cartesian physics; therefore, sensations of color and the like do not represent anything outside the mind." De Rosa’s attack on (KI) depends on interpreting the material falsity passages as asserting sensations to be intentional misrepresentations of the environment. Since (cf. point 6) this reading is not shown to be superior to others, with which it is inconsistent, her argument here is in need of further development. (Her attack on (KI) also involves the suggestion that in Descartes’ idea theory resemblance is not a necessary condition for intentional representation - a suggestion that seems dubious, in light of considerations raised in point 1 above.)

In spite of these (perceived) imperfections, De Rosa’s book presents an interesting thesis (as I hope the summary, preceding the criticisms, makes clear). It also addresses a wide range of Cartesian texts, and provides a useful entrée into the complex literature on Cartesian sensation theory. It is therefore a worthy contribution to the field. It should promote discussion of a topic that Hume rightly considered indispensible to an in-depth understanding of seventeenth and eighteenth-century philosophy.