Descartes' Cogito: Saved from the Great Shipwreck

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Sarkar, Husain, Descartes' Cogito: Saved from the Great Shipwreck, Cambridge, 2003, 326pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521821665.

Reviewed by Stephen I. Wagner, St. John's University


Husain Sarkar has done a service for Cartesian scholars and for others interested in Descartes’ thought by offering a sustained discussion of Descartes’ first certainty, his cogito. Sarkar’s work--the only book-length analysis of Descartes’ first truth in his order of discovery--helps us to clarify central elements of Cartesian thought and offers us suggestive directions for further discussion.

Sarkar makes it clear that his thesis is a very specific one—namely, that Descartes’ cogito should not be understood as an argument. He offers us, too, his own alternative reading of the cogito, as an “experiment.” Sarkar urges “that the negative claim offered here, namely, that the cogito is not an argument, is decisive. But that is not so with the positive thesis as to what the cogito is” (x). In the service of establishing his negative claim, Sarkar offers us a series of intensive analyses, attempting to show that the various ways of understanding the cogito as an argument fail.

Sarkar’s central thesis leads him to consider a broad range of issues related to his analysis of the cogito. Some of these are intriguing new contributions, such as the nature of the ideal inquirer, a characterization of perfect problems and their solutions, and a discussion of the first- and second-order mental states and processes involved in the cogito. One of the most significant of these issues, Sarkar suggests, is his identification of a new Cartesian Circle, which has central implications regarding his negative thesis.

Sarkar also offers us reflections on previous discussions of some central Cartesian issues, including the will, memory, degrees of doubt, Descartes’ struggle with the issue of the Eucharist, and attempts to resolve the Circle. His discussions of Descartes’ logic and the “content of the cogito” are especially thought-provoking. As a final step, Sarkar provides a wide-ranging series of appendices, commenting on writings by Robert Nozick, Anthony Kenny, and Jeffrey Tlumak and tying in his thoughts about the Port-Royal Logic and Francis Bacon. Overall, Sarkar offers us a wealth of ideas and questions to consider. Here, in line with Sarkar’s primary focus, I will concentrate my comments on the issues most closely connected to his discussion of the nature of the cogito.

Acknowledging that he cannot do justice to all of Descartes’ statements about the cogito, Sarkar hopes to provide “an interpretation that will save as much as possible of what is profound and interesting in Descartes” (x). In this pursuit, Sarkar proceeds according to what he calls his “Sulmo principle” (acknowledging a debt to Ovid) regarding a philosopher’s work: “Only after his death can we say that, if he had tied his views together at the end into a single consistent system, he would have done so in this way or that; only then can one judge the worth of the system” (xi).

To establish his negative thesis, Sarkar considers five ways in which the cogito has been analyzed as an argument. He considers two versions of a syllogistic reading (one “fully elaborated” and one enthymematic), Jaako Hintikka’s version of an argument employing quantification theory, Edwin Curley’s analysis involving an unstated “rule of inference” and Bernard Williams’ analysis relying on the “relation of presupposition.” He also considers Hintikka’s “performative view,” which Sarkar sees as ultimately relying on “an argument making use of several principles of logic and inference” (172). By gathering together these arguments, Sarkar has provided a valuable resource for those thinking about the cogito; his detailed analyses are suggestive for further thinking about these interpretations.

As Sarkar then puts it, “the heart of my thesis” follows these individual analyses--”there is one difficulty so deep and so irreparable that we had better conclude that the cogito is not an argument” (175). At this point, Sarkar applies his Sulmo principle, “bringing together elements that the philosopher himself did not bring together”:

The problem I have set myself is to determine the truth value of a counterfactual. It goes something like this: If Descartes had given us in the first meditation … his theory of deduction, his metaphysical doubts, the doctrine of the creation of the eternal truths, and the theory of memory, could Descartes have regarded the cogito as an argument … at the end of the third paragraph in the Second Meditation? (177)

Having posed the problem this way, Sarkar’s “proof” that the cogito cannot be construed as an argument seems to follow. On Sarkar’s proposal, Meditation I puts the principles of mathematics and logic in doubt—”the demon may well be deceiving [Descartes] into thinking that these principles of inference, like the cognate principles of mathematics, are true when in fact they are not” (187). And, “knowing that an argument is valid presupposes knowledge of the principles of inference” (187). But the inference rules cannot be justified prior to the discovery of the cogito and of the “general rule” that clear and distinct perceptions are true which “emerges … from the cogito” (93). Thus, Sarkar concludes that the cogito cannot be established as true in Meditation II through any process which relies on deductive inference.

Sarkar’s suggestion regarding a “new Cartesian Circle, more devastating than the old one” arises from this same aspect of the Meditation I doubts. “Prior to the proof of the existence of God, no principles of logic can be certified to be true or reliable. Without true or reliable principles of logic, Descartes could not execute the proof of the existence of God” (267-8). It is the role of the cogito and the general rule to provide that certification. Sarkar’s claim here regarding the circle seems to be an extension of a focus offered by George Nakhnikian regarding the strains put on Descartes’ project if his doubts extend to the reliability of deductive inference. Sarkar does well to emphasize the force of this concern.

Sarkar also supports his negative thesis by explaining that, for Descartes, both mediate and immediate inferential arguments must rely on memory. Sarkar points us here to what he sees as a crucial passage from the Rules for the Direction of the Mind, in which Descartes says that “self-evidence is not required for deduction, as it is for intuition; deduction in a sense gets its certainty from memory.” Sarkar reads this as a claim that deduction and intuition cannot be equally certain and he urges, “There is no evidence that ’deduction’ here refers only to mediate inference and not to immediate inference as well” (182, note). Since Sarkar’s Sulmo view takes the doubts of Meditation I to impugn memory, he concludes, on these grounds as well, that that the cogito cannot be either an immediate or mediate inference. Sarkar has presented an intriguing portrayal of Descartes’ project of doubt and its implications for the cogito. I will point to some reservations about both his negative and positive theses.

My primary reservation about Sarkar’s negative thesis involves the formulation of his problem. Descartes surely stated, at points in his writings, his metaphysical doubt, his doctrine of the creation of the eternal truths and his concerns about memory. It is not clear, though, that we should reconstruct Meditation I in a way which incorporates all of those doubts. Sarkar contends that “Such a reconstruction is permissible so long as it is consistent with his major views” (176). But Descartes’ insistence on the order of reasons and the order of discovery in the Meditations suggests, for example, that Descartes’ metaphysical doubt is appropriate only where it appears, in Meditation III, after the discovery of the cogito. The metaphysical doubt seems directed specifically toward Descartes’ assent-compelling perceptions. Its appearance in Meditation III seems to be an indication that there are no such perceptions in Meditation I and that the doubt represented by the demon only impugns perceptions involving some element of sensation or imagination. (Sarkar does look at Harry Frankfurt’s reading along these lines, on pages 207-8.) The question of the scope of the Meditation I and Meditation III doubts is, perhaps, the critical issue for understanding Descartes’ “validation of reason.” I am unsure that Sarkar’s characterization of Meditation I is appropriate; but he has comprehensively demonstrated many of the consequences which follow from constructing the doubts in the way that he has.

A similar concern could be raised regarding Sarkar’s claims about memory. Sarkar has helpfully pointed out Descartes’ hesitation, in the Rules, about the elimination of the fallibility of memory within our deductions. But in the Principles of Philosophy (I, 13) and in the Conversation with Burman (AT V, 148-9; CSM III, 335), we find Descartes expressing a different view. In the Principles, Descartes says that we can attend to the proof that the three angles of a triangle equal two right angles and be “completely convinced” of its truth. To Burman, Descartes says “we are able to grasp the proof of God’s existence in its entirety. As long as we are engaged in this process we are certain that we are not being deceived, and every difficulty is thus removed.” Sarkar’s analysis seems to indicate that Descartes’ views on this issue may have changed over time. And this change raises some questions about Sarkar’s reading. Nevertheless, Sarkar’s analysis highlights the importance of attending to Descartes’ concerns about memory.

Since Sarkar does not offer his positive thesis as decisive, I offer my concluding remarks to help to draw out some greater clarity in his proposal. Sarkar’s analysis would indeed be most intriguing if it can save Descartes from “the great shipwreck,” even in the presence of the comprehensive doubt which he builds into Meditation I. In describing the “thought experiment” which is his version of the cogito, Sarkar says that the meditator “sees—notices, perceives, intuits, witnesses—that it is true that in this particular case, his doubting now ensures his existence now” (78), explaining that this is a “clear and distinct notion” (82) which involves “the truth of the proposition of the cogito” (268). To ground Sarkar’s positive thesis, we need to understand how this intuition escapes the force of the Meditation I doubts.

Sarkar suggests one answer when he explains that the “principles” Descartes is doubting in Meditation I are “the five senses and the intellect” and that, in his reading of the cogito, he wants to “distinguish between the intellect principle and the principle of intuition” (50). But it is not obvious that this is a distinction which Descartes would acknowledge—intuitions do seem to be the clear perceptions of the intellect. At another point, Sarkar seems to portray the Meditation I doubt as more limited: “The doubting process will purify the mind and rid it of the intrusion of the senses … the better to hear the voice of reason” (69). This characterization suggests that Sarkar might intend his “intuition” to signify an intellectual grasp which can survive the doubt. A bit more clarity on this issue would help to solidify his positive thesis.

A further, and related, clarification seems important regarding Sarkar’s description of the precise intuition that is involved in the cogito: “… the doubter in the cogito-state learns to join the particular doubting thought with his particular existence” (78) And “the joining takes place in a simple, single mental state and does not involve a complex mental process” (82). It would add to the clarity of Sarkar’s positive thesis if we could spell out a bit more fully what is involved in this “joining.” We get some indication of an answer when Sarkar compares his view to Anthony Kenny’s analysis of the cogito and considers “a Kenny-like counterposition”—”Cogito ergo sum is an argument, but it is an argument that does not require the use of memory; the following of sum from cogito is an object of immediate intuition” (205, note 31). Sarkar raises some objections to this reading, stemming from Stoic logic and from his claims about the use of memory. He concludes by saying:

Finally, it is difficult to fathom the precise difference, if any, between the immediate intuition of the Kenny-like argument and the immediate intuition of a single proposition. (205, note 31)

Sarkar’s own view seems to involve this same “immediate intuition of a single proposition.” Further clarification of this point might well lead us to a way of more clearly differentiating or perhaps reconciling Kenny’s “argument” and Sarkar’s “experiment.”

Sarkar’s work has advanced our understanding of the nature of the cogito and of its place in the overall structure of Descartes’ metaphysical project. I think that the point to which he brings us—the immediately intuited “joining” of the meditator’s doubting and existing—is the issue which will most profitably repay further clarification. Sarkar’s work reminds us of the richness of Descartes’ thinking, and of his cogito in particular, as an area for ongoing investigation and as a source of unending insight.