Descartes, Malebranche, and the Crisis of Perception

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Walter Ott, Descartes, Malebranche, and the Crisis of Perception, Oxford University Press, 2017, 240 pp., $70.00 (hbk) ISBN 9780198791713.

Reviewed by Margaret Atherton, University of Wisconsin-Milwaukee


Walter Ott's book concerns the innovative theory of perception introduced in the seventeenth century by Descartes and Malebranche. As he himself says, this is ground that recent historians have already substantially plowed. There are at least two good reasons for all the attention paid to this theory. The first is that, fitting in as it does with advances made in the physical sciences, there is a great deal that seems right about it. Dispensing, as Descartes says in the Dioptrics, with little images flitting through the air, it seems to provide an inherently plausible account (for its day) of how perception works. The second reason, however, is the extreme difficulty scholars have found in working out exactly what positions Descartes and Malebranche were putting forward. All accounts currently in the literature must be regarded as highly controversial.

Walter Ott has adopted a method that promises to cut through the existing difficulties. He abandons the assumption that there is a single theory that each was putting forward throughout his publications, and works instead with the hypothesis that their positions changed over time. This new assumption permits Ott the interpretive strategy of looking for a consistent theory at a time, but not across time, and is the first way in which jis treatment differs from many others. Second, in pursuit of his strategy, Ott says he "let the texts speak for themselves, on their own terms." (p. viii) His work is commendable for the very careful attention he pays to the texts. Finally, the pay-off for Ott of his strategy is that he finds first Descartes and then Malebranche putting forward what are in essence a series of different theories of perception, each theory in turn designed to overcome problems with its predecessors. Ott's conclusion is that the difficulties faced in the end prove insurmountable, leading inevitably to an opposition theory, Berkeley's idealism. There is no way in which I can do justice to Ott's intricate argument or to the very many fascinating observations he makes along the way. I can only provide an outline of what can be found when what I hope will be Ott's very many interested readers take up this book.

Ott identifies four stages in Descartes's theorizing about perception. The first is laid out in Le Monde and, Ott argues, goes unchallenged in the Meditations, which does not contain an explicit account of perception. Ott shows that in Descartes's initial discussion of sense-perception in Le Monde, his interest lies in providing a mechanical, physiological account of the perception of individual bodies located in space. He needed a theory in which the physical world, including our own bodies, is endowed with geometric properties, the operation of which on our senses would form the bedrock of perceptual cognition. In this first attempt, Descartes replaces the traveling image of earlier theorists with the motion of animal spirits from the retina to the pineal gland, resulting in a brain-image, itself three-dimensional, that resembles the spatial properties of the original object. Ott argues that, in this version, Descartes holds that the mind is immediately aware of the brain image, resulting in a representation of the geometric properties, while also presenting itself with sensations on becoming aware of different non-resembling brain-states. At this stage, most of the work of determining what is perceived is located in the brain and brain images, which are inspected by the mind. Descartes then has got something that would presumably seem to him to be highly desirable: an account of perceptual interaction with the physical world in terms of the geometric properties demanded by his physics, while the sensible qualities emerge as mental reactions.

Ott argues that in the Meditations, Descartes in fact provides an argument that sensations, being non-resembling, do not represent. This is an important issue for Ott, since it is his view that what will ultimately prove problematic for Descartes is that the different kinds of corporeal states result in different kinds of mental states, resembling representations, non-resembling sensations and natural judgments. Inasmuch as our perceptual cognition is of an integrated perceptual world, Descartes now faces the task of explaining how this integration takes place. Ott also interestingly points out that Descartes does not conceptualize his project in terms of the "sensory core" discussed by Hatfield and Epstein,[1] a two-dimensional visual field that then must be developed into a three-dimensional visual world. That Descartes is not thinking in these terms reveals something about his project. The sensory core approach starts with sensations, color patches immediately present to us, and assigns to the perceiver the task of locating these patches in space. But this is not the task that initially interested Descartes. He is beginning with the assumption that the world is essentially spatial, and trying to account for perception on these grounds.

So far, so good. In the Dioptrics, however, Descartes reverses himself and tells us that the soul doesn't need to contemplate resembling images. Ott speculates that Descartes has come to recognize that the brain-image can't do all the work that he previously assigned to it, because of problems like size constancy. We perceive an object approaching us as of a constant size even though its image on the retina is growing larger. In any case, in the new version, the perceptions of both sensations and common geometric sensibles are entirely causal, while the location of perceptual content is achieved through natural judgments. Descartes now must assign a larger role to the mind. This role gets even larger in the Sixth Set of Replies, although the story changes somewhat. The subjects of the Sixth Set are the competing assessments Descartes is making about the unreliable senses and the reliable intellect. Here, after his standard physiological account, Descartes identifies two mental stages,. One, Ott thinks, consists of non-extended sensations.  The other is an elaborate set of judgments of the intellect, which first identifies an outward object, say a stick, by, Ott suggests, painting a region of space with color, and then calculating the size, shape and distance of the stick. The process here described is, Ott points out, almost completely unintelligible. How is the mind to identify a particular region of space with which to paint non-representational color sensations?

Ott finally supposes that Descartes makes one final try at an account of perceptual cognition in the Passions of the Soul and in the Principles of Philosophy. Here, the function of motions in the brain is just to trigger sensations and ideas of geometric properties in the mind. The mind now performs the task of referring these sensations and ideas onto those objects considered to be their causes. On this account, the work of constructing a visual world is the product of the mind, but how it is possible to locate sensations on that piece of the spatial world deemed to be their causes is left unexplained. This problem, which Ott calls the "selection problem" and attributes to Malebranche, is that of how a mind is able to select the appropriate region of space on which to refer its color sensations. While Ott takes Malebranche to have put his finger on a crucial problem, he is not sanguine about Malebranche's attempts to solve it.

After a bridge chapter, in which Ott shows that, having failed to paint himself out of a corner, Descartes left his Cartesian followers, including La Forge, Desgabets, Regis, and Arnauld, scrambling to solve this dilemma, Ott, for the remainder of the book, turns his attention to Malebranche. He frames his discussion around Malebranche's selection problem. Ott maintains that it is possible to trace a developmental change in Malebranche's theorizing, as there was in Descartes's, following it through changes in the various editions of The Search after Truth. He precedes this developmental story with a very interesting discussion of the ontology of sensations, as Malebranche sees it. Sensations have a unique ontological status, since Malebranche holds that we do not perceive bodies through representational ideas in our mind, but instead as ideas in God's mind. Sensations are modifications of our minds, which get joined with "pure perceptions" to result in perceptual cognition. Ott argues that it is inappropriate to call Malebranche, as is often done, an adverbialist with respect to sensations, inasmuch as he never suggests that sensations are modifications of acts of substances but instead that they are modifications of substances, that is, of minds themselves. Acts of sensing, then, have these modifications of minds as their objects. Ott concludes that Malebranche holds that acts of sensing are about something, but don't represent anything. So, as he had previously argued with respect to Descartes, Ott declares that Malebranchian sensations are non-representational. Again, this feature is going to stand in the way of solving the selection problem.

The first stage in the development of Malebranche's theory of perception, what Ott calls "Early Malebranche," is to be found in Books I-III of the first, 1674 edition of Search after Truth, in which Malebranche can be seen to have located himself basically in Sixth Set territory. Malebranche identifies as one element in sensation the passion of the soul that we sense in spite of ourselves and as another, final element, two natural judgments locating the object sensed in space. In the first judgment, a cube is represented as a three-dimensional object of unequal sides, and in the second, the sides are, as it were, corrected and judged to be of equal size. Ott points out that, as was the case in the Sixth Set of Replies, there is still no sensory core: we go straight from extensionless sensations to judgments about three-dimensional objects. These judgments, as was the case in the Sixth Set, are actually impossible to carry out. Since sensations are just unrelated objects of inner reflection, they can't be found to bear relations to anything spatial. Ott raises a second problem as well. It is hard to see how a sensation ends up localized on an object, or referred to it, since objects are distinguishable one from another in space by boundaries provided by color. How then can we identify an object on which to paint the appropriate color?

In what Ott calls "Middle Malebranche," consisting of the 1678 revisions of Books I-III, Malebranche abandons natural judgments for what he calls "compound sensations." Compound sensations are not the result of any judgments we make, but are instead given to us by God, and can be thought of as the result of judgments we would make if we knew as much as God. Ott is still dubious that this change in terminology is helpful, since he thinks that compounding extensionless sensations can't explain the acquisition of spatial relations.

What Ott calls "Later Malebranche" introduces several distinctively Malebranchian ideas, which Malebranche himself developed over a number of years. The first can be found in Elucidation X, and is either a development or a clarification of the way extension exists in God's mind. Malebranche says that God does not have a number of particular ideas of the extension of different bodies, but rather a single idea of intelligible extension, which joins with a human mind, whose sensations then, as Ott puts it, "'light up' a region of intelligible extension to give it a cube-ish shape." (p. 197) This action on the part of the mind, is, of course, rendered more, rather than less, unintelligible, since it entails that the mind knows what region of space to light up. In 1704, however, Malebranche makes another change, suggesting that it is the idea of intelligible extension that paints colors on the soul, and not the other way round. It is the idea that is efficacious, not the soul. While this development looks promising, Ott is dubious, since there is no obvious reason, he holds, why the idea of intelligible extension, considered as a cause, should end up joined to the sensation that is its effect. Ott concludes his account of Malebranche's development by pointing out that, by the time Malebranche was conducting his exchanges with Arnauld and Regis, he was endorsing an even more extreme doctrine.  This holds that there is no distinction between the idea of intelligible extension and what it represents; that the idea of intelligible extension is itself infinite and unbounded and the relationship between the idea of intelligible extension and extension is one of participation, not representation. At this point, Malebranche has abandoned Descartes's account entirely. Ott's story is of a promising theory of perception that collapses under its own weight.

As I said, the previous treatments of this history have all been controversial, and I suspect that Ott's contribution will also be found to be controversial. For one thing, a great deal of his account rests on his claim that neither Descartes nor Malebranche took sensations to be representational. While I am sympathetic to this view and to Ott's arguments on its behalf, I suspect there are others who will think otherwise. Nevertheless, the picture that Ott draws, of an optimistic theory of perception, based squarely on a view of what the physical world is like and how it operates, that gradually, as the need for ever more complicated mental processes unfold, lost contact with that physical world, is a fascinating one, and Ott's book deserves the same close and careful study he himself put into it.

[1] Gary Hatfield and William Epstein, "The Sensory Core and the Medieval Foundations of Early Modern Perceptual Theory." Isis, 70, 3 (1979) 363-84.