Descartes's Concept of Mind

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Alanen, Lilli, Descartes's Concept of Mind, Harvard, 2003, 370pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0674010434.

Reviewed by Desmond M. Clarke, University College, Cork, Ireland


This is a contribution to an already crowded field of studies, in which today’s readers attempt to make sense of what Descartes says about the mental features of human beings. The title accurately points towards the book’s focus – the concept or concepts deployed by Descartes in this enterprise. Evidently, there were many such concepts, most of them necessarily borrowed from scholastic philosophy. Descartes could hardly have invented a completely new language of mind and still hope to communicate with his readers in the seventeenth century. Given the number and range of concepts used by Descartes, one has to select. That, in turn, presupposes some conclusion about Cartesian anthropology. Lilli Alanen accepts, from the outset, ’both Descartes’s dualism and his view of the mind-body union’ (p. 43). Her initial target is a discussion of ’the mind as embodied’ (ibid.). Rather than get distracted by arguments about dualism, therefore, she begins her discussion with suggestions about embodiment that Descartes develops after 1643, especially in his correspondence with Princess Elizabeth.

The remainder of the book is a study of some of the concepts by which Descartes describes key features of human experience in which the unity of human nature, or the embodiment of the mind, is especially apparent. These include human consciousness, the intentionality of thought, sensory perception, the passions, and free will.

Chapter 2 focuses on Descartes’ claim that we need three primitive notions for thinking about human nature: the notions of the soul, of the body, and of their union. When this suggestion is combined with his somewhat unclear analysis of what it means for concepts to be ’clear and distinct’, Alanen argues that the relevant primitive notion for thinking about the unity of human nature is not ’distinct’. ’But since the notion or perception we have of the mind-body union, unlike those of extension and thought, is not in itself clearly and distinctly conceivable, we have to put up with something less than clear and distinct knowledge where the union is concerned’ (p. 62). She suggests that scientific knowledge [in Descartes’ sense of scientia] is limited to what we know about body or mind when considered separately, and that the kind of knowledge that we can have about our embodiment cannot be scientific. Alanen links these comments with familiar proposals by Wittgenstein and some of his commentators, to the effect that the concept of the union of mind and body is an ’ordinary language’ concept that is ’logically primitive’ (p. 75), and that it ’cannot be translated into technical (philosophical or scientific) terms without losing its original meaning’ (p. 75). This seems like a miscue, because all three notions listed for Princess Elizabeth were equally primitive and, as far as I can see, are equally unscientific in the relevant sense.

The sharp dichotomy that Descartes assumes between human and animal sensations might lead one to expect that he has identified some criterion or criteria common to all cases of genuine thought. Alanen addresses this question in Chapter 3. She points out, correctly in my view, that it is important to keep in mind the direction in which the argument runs here. It cannot be the case that Descartes begins with some form of dualism and then uses that to explain that thinking is irreducible to material processes. The argument runs in the opposite direction, namely: human thought exhibits various features that cannot be explained in terms of the Cartesian concept of matter (which, unavoidably, leaves Descartes with some form of dualism). The remainder of this chapter examines some of the features that commentators, such as Vendler and Malcolm, have identified as defining characteristics of thought, such as its consciousness or its propositional character. There is a danger of losing one’s way in the discussion here – of confounding the problems raised by contemporary philosophers with the rather different assumptions that were built into the Cartesian project.

Questions about intentionality are further developed in Chapters 4 and 5. Alanen examines various uses of the terms ’idea’ and ’representation’ to help clarify Descartes’ theory of intentionality and to see if it is coherent. It is not easy to follow the analysis offered here, partly because Descartes notoriously exploits various bits of scholastic terminology, as he thinks fit, and partly because Alanen tries to clarify Descartes’ already confused usage by comparing it with that of Brentano, Husserl, and a relatively large selection of scholastic authors from Ockham to Suarez. One of the fundamental problems, in this context, is: how do ideas (whatever they are) succeed in representing something or in having a specific content?

Descartes thought he could make some progress with this question by first comparing ideas with images, and by then denying that ideas represent in the same way as images do. On first reading, this sounds much worse than it really is. It is clear from some early writings, especially the Rules and the Dioptrics, that Descartes began his reflections on ideas as representations by considering brain patterns (including those of non-human animals), and by examining ways in which they could ’represent’ objects of perception without resembling them. When he later began to think about ideas, he tried to generalize and, in some sense, to immaterialize the capacity to represent that such brain patterns must have. The link between the two kinds of ’idea’ is clarified in the Second Replies to Objections, when Descartes writes: ’Thus I do not apply the term “ideas” only to the images which are depicted in the imagination; in fact, I do not call them ideas at all here, insofar as they are depicted in the bodily imagination, that is, in some part of the brain, but only insofar as they inform the mind itself when it turns towards that part of the brain’ (vii. 160-1). Alanen comments on this passage: ’That images depicted in the (corporeal) imagination are not called ideas at all is stressed explicitly in the definition of “idea” at the end of the Second Replies’ (p. 119). However, Descartes does not say that such images in the brain are not ideas at all. They are. He was trying to explain that he was not concerned in the Meditations with such images except insofar as they informed the mind in some way. How they do that, and whether their physical structure is relevant to this role, remains to be seen.

One of the most contentious and least intelligible suggestions made by Descartes is the claim, in the Third Meditation, about what he calls the realitas objectiva (vii. 41) of ideas. The suggestion seems to be that each idea, formally, is a mental act on the part of a particular thinking subject, and that many of these acts refer to or represent external realities (such as the sun) that exist independently of the act of thinking. Descartes uses the phrase realitas objectiva to denote something that is neither the mental act nor the entity to which it refers (including non-existing things, to which we can also refer). Even more mysterious, he claims that some kind of hierarchy obtains when we compare the realitates objectivae of different ideas, that some of them include more reality than others, and that this hierarchy must reflect a similar hierarchy of degrees of reality in the causes of ideas.

Alanen tries to make sense of this suggestion—an almost impossible task—by reference to similar suggestions by various scholastic writers. At the same time, she emphasizes the extent to which Descartes departed from scholastic usage to make some novel contributions to the theory. One is in danger of getting distracted at this point by the analogies and disanalogies with various authors, and with the sheer impenetrability of the thesis itself. Alanen comments: ’At best, the account of representation Descartes gives is incomplete—at worst, it is inconsistent’ (p. 134). I would have preferred a more focused effort to say, in contemporary English, what Alanen thinks Descartes thought, even if that involved accepting the second of these alternatives

Whatever account of representation one attributes to Descartes, there remains a problem waiting to emerge in his apparently inconsistent comments about sensation. Part of the difficulty here derives from the fact that, in early works such as The World and the Dioptrics, Descartes sketched the beginnings of a scientific explanation of perception. The most developed version of this theory applied to visual perception. Here Descartes could exploit his work on refraction and, more generally, his work on the transmission of light, and he combined that with some rather primitive investigations into the physiology of the nerves. The big problem, then as now, was how to put together these preliminary investigations into the mechanisms involved in perception with the experience of perception described from the perspective of the perceiver. The latter perspective seems to dominate discussions in the Meditations, including those sections where he talks about truth and falsity in judgments. Alanen focuses on two interrelated problems in Chapter 5: (a) whether and in what sense sensations are representative; and (b) what Descartes means by the material falsity of ideas.

She argues that all ideas, including sensory ideas, are representative of or about something or other. There is an obvious sense in which the idea of God refers to God or the idea of a cat refers to a cat. It is less obvious what the feeling of cold refers to, and one might be tempted to resolve this problem by distinguishing (as Rorty did) between genuinely representative ideas and those, such as a feeling of pain or cold, that are no more than feelings. However, Descartes offers a parallel interpretation of both kinds of idea in the Principles (I, 70, 71). What distinguishes some sensory idea from others is not that they are not about something, but that what they are about is inadequately clear. This allows Alanen to make sense of Descartes’ otherwise confusing claim that, although truth and falsity occur only in judgments, there is a kind of ’material falsity’ even in some ideas before a judgment is made. For her, ’material falsity pertains … to unanalyzed, confused, and complex sensory ideas, whose components turn out to be, on closer scrutiny, incompatible’ (p. 160). In other words, many complex perceptions arrive in the mind accompanied by implicit judgments. Descartes had explained in the Dioptrics how we gather information from a wide range of sensory sources — for example, from the clarity of a visual image, the perception of movement in our eye muscles, the contraction or expansion of the pupil of the eye, etc. The visual perception that results from this kind of complex sensory perception often includes an implicit judgment about the object of perception. His official account of what takes place here is that we make a judgment, in a strict sense, only when we adopt a position with respect to the conformity or otherwise of our perceptions with reality. This is consistent with also claiming that, even at the point that immediately precedes such a judgment, some of our ideas include interpretative features that we may be tempted to endorse without reflection. In that sense, ideas may be materially false.

Given the focus in recent years on the Cartesian account of the passions as a kind of thought in which body and soul are inextricably linked, it is not surprising that Alanen devotes one of the longest chapters in her book to this topic. Descartes defined passions as ’those perceptions, sensations or emotions of the soul which we refer particularly to it, and which are caused, maintained and strengthened by some movement of the spirits’ (AT XI, 349). This definition includes elements of a phenomenological description (of how the passions appear to the subject who experiences them) and some elements of Descartes’ theory. While trying to explain why they are called ’passions’, Descartes relies on the familiar suggestion that the same reality may be perceived as passive or as active from different points of view. ’We should recognize that what is a passion in the soul is usually an action in the body’ (AT XI, 328). This allows him to have it both ways with the passions. As events in the mind, they are passively caused there by something that is external to the mind. As actions, they result directly and automatically from specific bodily states which, in turn, reflect natural dispositions to protect one’s life and interests. However, I was surprised to find Alanen comment on this that ’passions in the strict sense of the word both depend causally on motions in the body and are identified with those motions’ (p. 174). I cannot see how passions can be identified with bodily motions and, at the same time, be ’perceptions of the soul’, unless we assume that Descartes has accepted some form of anomalous monism. However, Alanen attributes to Descartes what she calls, by adapting Davidson’s language, ’anomalous dualism’ (p. 176). Given the kind of arguments that are notoriously offered by Descartes in support of some kind of dualism, it seems as if he cannot identify emotional states with bodily states. He seems rather to acknowledge the close connection between them without being able to close the gap completely.

Such a conclusion is more consistent with the remainder of Alanen’s argument. For example, she claims that the action-passion identity, or the correlation between specific bodily states and their corresponding mental states, is a token-token identity (p. 177). We simply experience the reality of their connections, although we lack any coherent theory of why certain bodily states trigger specific emotional responses. This is not simply because our theory is inadequate, although that is a factor. The deeper reason is that the emotional states we experience depend on the personal history of each individual, on the kinds of experiences they have had and on their own psychological history. Thus, what causes fear on one person might cause a very different emotion in another.

The final and longest chapter, on free will and virtue, tries to make sense of various claims that Descartes made, over a relatively long time, about our ability to choose. Here, as in other chapters, Alanen informs the reader about a number of alternative interpretations of the Cartesian account of the will, and matches up many of those with suggestions from a wide range of ancient authors and/or positions, including Aristotle, Aquinas, the Stoics, Augustine, Anselm, Scotus, et al. Given the fact that Descartes’ view may have changed from his initial comments to his final efforts in the Passions of the Soul, the sheer multiplicity of texts and potential interpretations tends to confuse the reader and to occlude Analen’s own suggestions.

This book reads like an extended discussion of the literature on some Cartesian concepts over the past two or three decades. Almost everyone who has contributed to the discussion of Cartesian concepts of idea, consciousness, intentionality, sensation, etc. is mentioned, with meticulous acknowledgement of sources. Besides engaging with that rather large community of scholars, Alanen is careful to compare Cartesian concepts with earlier views that may have influenced them, from Plato and Aristotle to Scotus and Suarez. The result of this heady mix is often a feeling of bewilderment as one negotiates between the ancient past and the present with a view to understanding the early modern. Alanen’s own views are displaced, in the process, and become somewhat peripheral. She would have done both herself and her readers a service by more radical pruning of earlier versions of her work, and by a more systematic engagement with Cartesian texts. I suspect, however, that had she done this she might have changed her mind about a Cartesian concept of mind. She may have found that Descartes was floundering, for the most part, when he tried to describe the phenomenology of mental experience and that the concepts he used were inconsistent, unclear, and for the most past borrowed. This may be explained either by thinking of him as a very unsuccessful philosopher of mind, or as something else entirely: a natural philosopher whose primary target was an explanation of mental features of human beings, and who was content to work with the inadequate, descriptive categories of his predecessors.

I noticed a few typos, including one in the very title of the Latin Meditations: ’philosophia’ (p. 37); ’claire’ (p. 64); Marleen (69).