Desiring the Good: Ancient Proposals and Contemporary Theory

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Katja Maria Vogt, Desiring the Good: Ancient Proposals and Contemporary Theory, Oxford University Press, 2017, 219pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190692476.

Reviewed by Jan Szaif, University of California, Davis


How does desiring what is good for us direct our decisions and actions? Katja Vogt's most recent book tackles this question. While it provides interpretations of various texts by Plato and Aristotle, it is written primarily as a contribution to contemporary debate, advocating a (broadly speaking) neo-Aristotelian approach. Her guiding idea is that to "desire the good" is to desire that one's life go well. Against a tradition in contemporary action theory that she traces back to Anscombe, Vogt wants to establish that our motivation for small-scale actions is ultimately rooted in this desire to live well and, furthermore, that "pursuits," as a form of mid-level activity, play a crucial role in mediating between the vague desire for a good life and our day-to-day activities. In response to the question of how we can know the good (for us), she advocates a view dubbed "measure realism."

Chapter 1, "A Blueprint for Ethics," takes its starting point from the Philebus, one of Plato's very late dialogues. Vogt uses it as a template to develop the basic question underlying her approach, the "Question Q: What is the good?," to be construed as referring either to the abstract property good or to what is good for humans. As Vogt points out, the Philebus acknowledges the need for a metaphysical investigation of the property good, but postpones this task in order to approach the Q question from the angle of the human agent who aims to realize a good life.

As the ultimate source of motivation, this thing -- "the good" -- is formally characterized by completeness, sufficiency, and universal desirability (Phil. 20d). Vogt emphasizes the obvious continuity between this set of criteria and the central argument of book 1 of the Nicomachean Ethics. Yet one could object that the Philebus has its own way of fleshing out a theory of the good on the basis of these criteria. It conceptualizes the good life as a life that achieves the correct mixing of a plurality of substantive goods in order to then discuss the merits of hedonic experiences and cognitive states as putative ingredients of the good life. Vogt's Aristotelianizing reading of the Philebus exceeds what is warranted by Plato's text when she interprets his discussion of the hedonic and cognitive ingredients as being about activities rather than mental states and feelings/perceptions.

Another noteworthy element of this chapter is her account of how the ontological character of human lives as "goings-on" connects with the metaphysics of process-like being in nature, as adumbrated in the Philebus. This kind of link between ethics and metaphysics is an important theme throughout her book.

Chapter 2, "The Good and the Good Human Life," further develops some of the basic ideas and assumptions of her approach in conversation with the first book of the Nicomachean Ethics. Choices made by agents are informed by a substantive notion of a what it means for a human life to go well. This is the "final agential good," which Aristotle's ethics tries to clarify and precisify. Vogt argues that Aristotle introduces this way of talking about "the good" as if it were something generally agreed upon, but that this is somewhat disingenuous since other ancient ethicists have responded to the Q-question with an analysis of the property good or by identifying the good with just one value (like pleasure, or virtue). While Vogt embraces the Aristotelian focus on the agential good, she distances herself from how Aristotle ranks human lives, arguing instead for a pluralistic (but not relativistic) approach that allows for a variety of ways in which a human life can succeed. She chooses to work with the notion of a "life going well," rather than "happiness" (eudaimonia), in view of the misleading association of the English word "happiness" with a certain kind of mood. She dwells, of course, also on the familiar point that Aristotle identifies the eudaimonic condition as a form of activity rather than as possession of one or several goods. By emphasizing activity, Aristotle "pulls" the good into the sphere of human influence away from the influence of gods or fortune as in traditional beliefs about eudaimonia.

Chapter 3, "Disagreement, Value, Measure," proceeds from an interpretation of Plato's dialogue Euthyphro, in which the interlocutors try to define piety. Like most interpreters, Vogt tries to identify some important philosophical insights in this short aporetic dialogue. What she takes away from it are mainly the following two points: The good is a basic or first-order value property, whereas piety is a (bi-directionally) relational value property that presupposes basic value properties such as the good and the just. (To mention a possible objection: Toward the end, the dialogue suggests that piety is a species of the just. If piety is a relational value property, it would seem that justice as its genus is so too.) Her second point is that disagreements about value, according to the Euthyphro, are caused by the absence of a "measure" that would enable a clear resolution.

This observation about measure provides the transition to Chapter 4, in which Vogt combines metaphysical with epistemological considerations in order to formulate her idea of "measure-realism." To this end, she engages with Protagoras' "man is the measure"-doctrine. An important disclaimer is hidden in a footnote (p. 92, n. 1): she does not intend to reconstruct the position of the historical Protagoras or its elaboration in Plato's Theaetetus. Still, because of the way this chapter is written it is not always clear if she is interpreting the source text or developing her own position.

In order to guide the reader to measure realism, Vogt deconstructs Protagoras' language of "seemings" in six steps. I mention the following three: To begin with, the fact that seemings are relative to the perceiver does not imply that they cannot be false (which is, of course, a truism). Moreover, humans can be subject to better or worse seemings depending on what condition they are in. The acknowledgment of this difference requires some form of commitment to realism about value. Accordingly, the good-for relation has a foundation in reality, and human life -- with its underlying psychology, its needs and abilities, characteristic activities, etc. -- functions as the measure relative to which we have to find out what is good for us. Yet, finally, this will not produce definitive results that hold once and for all, since this measure is subject to improvement in an open-ended process. Vogt claims that the resulting "measure realism" is characterized by "a relative, not a relativistic, notion of value and a relative way the world is for us" (p. 104), occupying some kind of a middle ground between plain realism and relativism.

A critical question: When pondering how to live, do I (or should I) focus on the fact that my life is a human life? Vogt claims that "human beings qua group are the primary relatum for ethics" (p. 104), yet adds that agents need to further narrow this down with reference to their individual lives and particular circumstances. This qualification means that it is still an open question how much relevance the fact that we are leading human lives has for identifying the values that can make, say, my life or yours a good life. This needs further elaboration and justification.

At first glance it is hard to see how Vogt's measure realism, as a theory of the human good, differs from Aristotle's position, as expressed in his famous argument about the human function and also in his account of virtuous action as aiming at the "mean relative to us." One might wonder why she takes the detour via Protagoras. Vogt's answer is that she does not want her approach to be committed to the standard of a perfect person, the Aristotelian phronimos (p. 105), since finding out for oneself what the good life is always going to be work in progress, both on account of the plasticity of human life and since the cognitive process is open-ended.

In this context, Vogt also takes a (perhaps unnecessary?) leap into moral theory narrowly understood, arguing that on account of the dynamic and provisional character of this human measure and our understanding of it, even a moral principle such as the condemnation of slavery cannot be an absolute truth (pp. 106-7). She leaves, of course, no doubt about her own unequivocal rejection of slavery. Her point is a theoretical one. Roughly, if the human good is something dynamic both in a metaphysical and in an epistemological sense, there can be no moral absolutes as understood by the traditional moral realist. The reader wonders if this does not indicate a shortcoming of her approach. To begin with, claims about moral absolutes may be grounded, for instance, in claims about personhood -- on account of the difference between an object and a person (of whatever biological species) and how this difference bears on whether it could ever be right to own another person as a piece of property. To be sure, this kind of reasoning might require conceptual resources that go beyond Aristotle.

Chapter 5, "The Guise of the Good," follows up on her initial claim that Aristotle's understanding of the Q-question entails the view that our individual choices or decisions are informed by our desire to lead a good life. The chapter sets out a core element of Vogt's approach: the distinction between three levels of practical concern. At each level, something presents itself under "the guise of the good" (sub specie boni) and thus exerts a motivating force. Vogt hopes to correct "a longstanding trend" in contemporary action theory: the tendency to focus on small-scale actions and their justificatory reasons. By the same token, she also takes sides in a current debate among Aristotle scholars in support of what has come to be known as the Grand-End theory. Our large-scale motivation is to lead a good life (the Grand End). Vogt elaborates that this is something we don't justify but simply want (under normal psychological conditions). All other pursuits become pointless if we no longer desire for our lives to go well. The intermediate level is that of pursuits. They too are something we want rather than choose in light of a specific reason. We have to find out which pursuits satisfy us in order to find out what a good life can mean to us. As for small-scale actions (such as buying a cow, or preparing for an exam), we typically choose them because they contribute to a pursuit to which we are committed (such as farming, or studying).

A possible objection: Unhappiness, or the latent sense of living an unsatisfactory life, is not uncommon, yet in most cases people carry on with their mid-level pursuits and small-scale actions. What motivates them? Take the example of a farmer who hates farming, but still carries on because he lacks viable alternatives. Perhaps he sticks to his current profession just so as to avoid an even more miserable situation for himself? Yet what if part of the story is a sense of obligation toward some people that depend on him? How would Vogt account for the person who carries on, out of some sense of obligation toward certain others, yet without expectation of a good life?

With respect to how pursuits and actions constitute a good life, there is an important Aristotelian distinction that Vogt does not make use of, but that in my view should not be neglected. In Book 6 of the Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle emphasizes the need to distinguish between two kinds of activity or pursuit: productive activity (poiêsis) that aims at a certain end-state and outcome different from the activity itself, and energeia-activity, which has the ontological characteristic that it lacks an intrinsic end-point and is complete at any given moment. An example would be the difference between helping a neighbor mend a fence and practicing neighborly virtue. While the former type of description individuates an action that unfolds in temporal steps and remains incomplete if interrupted by intervening circumstances, the latter type of description would still fully apply despite the interruption. One would still have been exerting neighborly virtue at any given moment of this activity. Aristotle is quite clear that action descriptions of the latter kind are what individuates the components of the good life. Why is this significant? Because completeness is part of his formal characterization of the highest agential good, also adopted by Vogt. If the good life is constituted by energeia-activities, it becomes much easier to see how a human life could realize a "complete good." Productive activities will often not attain their intended outcome, yet a life that pursues such activities in a manner displaying good judgment and character can still be deemed to have attained a "complete good," despite occasional failure with respect to outcomes. To be sure, Aristotle does not, like the Stoics, totally dismiss the relevance of outcomes for our eudaimonia, but he does emphasize that the inherently excellent ("virtuous") quality of our energeia-activity is the foundational element of a eudaimonic life.

Chapter 6, entitled "The Nature of Pursuits," uses the argumentation of Socrates/Diotima in Plato's Symposium as a foil for raising a number of important issues pertaining to the topic of mid-level activities. One of Vogt's goals here is to acquit her neo-Aristotelian approach from the charge of promoting a selfish attitude. Vogt points out that many of the pursuits that agents find worthwhile and that give content to their idea of a good life involve a form of value commitment that goes beyond a merely self-regarding concern. Among her examples are good parenting, good craftsmanship, and good legislating. My concern here is that our talk of being a good parent, or being a good legislator, already presupposes and incorporates the idea of a certain moral attitude, for instance, a sense of justice. The abstract notion of a commitment to values that transcend one's own self does not yet, as such, entail commitment to an attitude of impartiality in situations that make demands on our sense of justice. More than a commitment to self-transcending values is needed to ground such an attitude in our desire to live well.

Vogt also claims that most of our pursuits track real value. How so? What is the philosophical justification for this realist claim? At this point, Aristotelians have traditionally resorted to the idea that human nature is the "measure" for what can be of real value for humans. This then raises the specter of a "naturalistic fallacy." More needs to be said to address this concern.

In line with the argumentative thread of the Diotima speech, chapter 6 also discusses the human desire for immortality. The Diotima speech does not presuppose the notion of an immortal soul as we know it from the Phaedo and other Platonic dialogues. Rather, it talks about the extension of one's self beyond the limits of mortal life through biological procreation and various forms of intellectual creativity. Vogt speaks rather elegantly of "mortal forms of immortality." She is right, I think, in criticizing much of the philosophical literature on rational decision and action for disregarding how mortality factors into our rational motivation. One may have doubts, however, about the applicability of the term "immortality" in this context. While procreation or intellectual creativity may be seen as ways to extend one's own active life beyond the limit set by our mortality, they fall short of producing anything "everlasting" -- for the obvious reason that not even the human species (or our galaxy, for that matter) will last forever. Following Diotima's lead, Vogt describes the desire for immortality as a "necessary companion desire" of our rational response to the good. In my view, one could gain a different, and more adequate, approach to this subject-matter if one started from the role of death as a natural evil and the corresponding emotional response of fear of death. It seems that the human desire for immortality is primarily a reaction to this kind of fear and not a consequence of how our response to the good transcends concern with only our own life.

Vogt's final chapter offers a discussion of the metaphysics of the subject-matter of ethics. Here she dissociates her neo-Aristotelian approach from ethical particularism and discusses the role and applicability of generalizations in ethical theory in the face of contingency as a defining characteristic of the sphere of action. Finally, her concluding remarks review some of the themes of her book. One of the things she does here is to draw our attention to the fact that she hasn't talked about virtue or teleology. What then, she asks, is Aristotelian about her approach (p. 193)? Her answer points to Aristotle's notion of "the good for (human beings)" as the guiding concept for ethics and to his metaphysics of the sphere of action as a domain of regularity "for the most part." These are the key Aristotelian elements in her approach.

Notwithstanding my (hopefully constructive) criticisms, I have no doubt that Vogt's book is an important and very welcome contribution for all those who are interested in developing an Aristotelian approach in the context of contemporary ethics. She puts into focus certain deficits of the contemporary discussion and provides a compelling example for how engagement with ancient texts can benefit the contemporary debate.