Dialectics, Politics, and the Contemporary Value of Hegel's Practical Philosophy

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Andrew Buchwalter, Dialectics, Politics, and the Contemporary Value of Hegel's Practical Philosophy, Routledge, 2012, 342pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415806107.

Reviewed by Richard T. Peterson, Michigan State University


What is the best way to establish the "contemporary value" of the work of a great philosopher? One approach is to examine how earlier conceptualizations can be recast in the language of contemporary debates over issues the thinker once addressed in a different vocabulary, for example, translating Hegelian ideas of morality and ethics into the language of recent analytical philosophy. Another approach is to test how ideas from an earlier period help us to think about questions that are distinctive to our own time, for example, how recognition theory helps us respond to issues of multiculturalism that arise from new forms of immigration and cross-national political conflict.

Either approach requires both interpreting and re-articulating the language and ideas of hallowed texts, a contentious, if potentially fruitful, undertaking. To be sure, establishing contemporary value is hardly the only reason to study the history of philosophy, and one might think that such an emphasis can obscure much of what is interesting and valuable in learning from the past. So we can take Andrew Buchwalter's attempt to show how Hegel's practical philosophy has contemporary value to be a project of distinctive ambition. It is a project that he pursues carefully, developing arguments informed by extensive knowledge of the relevant debates and sensitive to troubling issues of our period. As a collection of previously published articles, the volume lacks systematic unity, though its parts are consistent and complementary. The texts have received some unifying revision and the book comes with a useful introductory overview of Buchwalter's concerns and emphases.

While Buchwalter does occasionally put Hegel in dialogue with recent thinkers and does confront Hegelian ideas with new problems, his more characteristic tack is to stick closely to Hegel's own texts and language when considering them in relation to subsequent thinkers and problems. In fact, his volume's range of discussion is wider than its title's reference to the contemporary suggests, since among the subsequent figures with whom he brings Hegel's work into sustained comparison are Marx and Adorno, and, indeed, a good part of the discussion casts its net far into the philosophical past. But his intent to assert the abiding philosophical value of Hegel's conceptual approach remains the guiding thread.

His argument is to some extent historical as well as conceptual, since his view of Hegel's continuing timeliness draws from the idea that Hegel's thought is in many respects at one with the ongoing experience of modernity. If the various dialectical oppositions associated with Hegel (among them subject and object, interiority and exteriority, individual and society, freedom and necessity) remain fruitful precisely as oppositions (Buchwalter often speaks of "bifurcations"), this is because the corresponding divisions as well as potential mediations for their resolution grow from dynamics proper to the modern world itself. Perhaps most basic for Buchwalter are those dialectical oppositions that surround the unstable yet unavoidable theme of subjectivity, which he argues is for Hegel the locus of the central problems of modernity.

In addition to the authors just mentioned, Buchwalter responds to a number of thinkers (Marcuse, Habermas, and Honneth among them) whose interest in Hegel comes by way of materialist criticism. Despite Buchwalter's sympathies with the critical social interests of such thinkers, his own allegiances seem to be with Hegel understood in the kind of rationalist holistic monism that is expressed in Hegel's emphasis on the ideal nature of the world as objective reason. Indeed, a recurring theme in this book is that Hegel's thought often does a better job with the problems that his critics cite in their challenges to him. For example, the Marx and Adorno chapters in the book's first section draw on a contrast to which Buchwalter frequently returns, that between immanent and transcendent critique. He argues that Marx cannot sustain immanent critique as well as Hegel, just as Adorno cannot really do better by way of a transcendent critique than Hegel himself provides. While the later thinkers pose new issues -- alienated industrial labor in the case of Marx, the discontinuity of modernity in the wake of fascism and genocide in the case of Adorno -- Buchwalter insists that Hegel's dialectical holism provides a framework that remains superior or at least is not outstripped by the alternatives they explore.

The significance for Buchwalter of Hegel's balancing of the immanent and the transcendent seems to lie in its ability to retain a genuinely historical account of the emergence of the solutions of modern "bifurcations," while never losing sight of the need to offer specifically philosophical normative argumentation. Hegel avoids the danger of inadequate mediation on the one hand and the danger of insufficient normative rigor on the other. The other chapters in this section -- on Habermas' idea of constitutionalism and on Rawls' approach to pluralism -- similarly argue for the more nuanced and richer conception for the earlier thinker.

The second section, entitled "Modernity and Secularity," is more thematic in focus, though it too seeks to defend Hegel against misunderstandings that obscure the scope of his achievement. Of particular interest here is Buchwalter's confrontation with other scholars who in many respects share his estimate of Hegel's continuing importance, particularly Charles Taylor and Robert Pippin. Their interpretations are taken as offering an "expressivist" reading of Hegel, one that Buchwalter believes one-sidedly emphasizes the social embodiment of principles that must be developed subjectively as well. Here, as elsewhere, Buchwalter's characteristic emphasis is on dialectical oppositions, both sides of which need to be sustained in order to achieve the holistic insights of Hegel's way of thinking. The other chapters in this part of the book, on the scientization of practical philosophy, Hegel on virtue, and the interplay of theology and republicanism, are more directly engaged with Hegel's attempt to sustain a place for religion in a modern world whose public institutions are secular. Though Buchwalter does not go very far into current discussions of religion and politics, there can be little doubt that the status and nature of secular commitments and institutions are questions that strike a contemporary chord.

The same can be said for themes of the third section of the book, whose three chapters deal with issues arising from the increasingly global orientation of our economic, cultural, and political lives. Here Buchwalter addresses Hegel's contribution to an international perspective on politics, the development of a viable notion of global justice, and the charge that Hegelian thought is narrowly Eurocentric. While Buchwalter acknowledges Hegel's resistance to such attempts as Kant's to explore the promise of international institutions, he argues that Hegel still has much to offer reflection on the problems and prospects of globalization. Here he emphasizes the potential of recognition theory for thinking about the relations across national boundaries and argues further that Hegel's analysis of modern inequality provides a basis for thinking about redistribution in a way that would address the grave inequalities that operate today on the global level.

This portrait of Hegel as a theorist of international norms that might constrain national communities will come as a surprise to those who understand him as treating the nation state as the ultimate level of political power. Buchwalter does seem to be straining here to affirm the contemporary force of Hegel's ideas, which, in any case, would not add much to recent discussions. Buchwalter notes the speculative aspect of this part of his argument, in effect acknowledging the ambiguities that arise when thinking about contemporary problems with work from another period. Here again he relies on his thesis that Hegel's promise for us rests on the dialectical analysis being rooted in modern conditions that in many respects persist.

One can, however, turn this insight against Hegel insofar as the limits on what he has to say about present issues may reflect shortcomings in the response he made to the problems of his own time. Insofar as an updated Hegel reworks the strategies of recognition and redistribution that informed the Philosophy of Right, they are equally prey to institutionally minded criticisms of that work. In broad terms, Hegel's solutions were ways of establishing how the modern market economy and constitutional state could achieve the liberal goal of a society in which all citizens are free. But the institutional modifications favored by Hegel either could not be instituted or proved insufficient for realizing this goal. Two hundred years later, we have good reasons to think that the goal of universal freedom is either an illusion or that it requires more fundamental institutional changes than Hegel could envision. In other words, the conflicts that divide modern society are deeper than Hegel was able to grasp and they seem to have proven in one way or another endemic to the institutional options developed in the modern period.

Buchwalter does not really acknowledge the difficulties that this creates for thinking in Hegelian terms about contemporary issues. Why not think that adhering too closely to Hegel will only reproduce an insufficiently critical perspective on the institutional conditions for addressing such outstanding problems as inequality and cultural conflict? It would help to think more about the actual relation between Hegelian conceptual strategies and his treatment of social structure, for example, how the state is to actualize the alleged potential of civil society to provide the preconditions of a society of free individuals. If, as Hegel seems to think, there is a kind of parallel between the unfolding of his dialectical categories and the organization of objective spirit, then might this not imply that those categories are in some way compromised when it comes to genuinely critical social reflection?

No doubt, such general considerations should not inhibit testing conceptual approaches with specific problems. But, even then, it is relevant to recall too that Hegel's claims for philosophical knowledge assume a kind of integration of historical and philosophical theory that can hardly be sustained today, considerations of interdisciplinary collaboration notwithstanding. The familiar Hegelian claim cited by Buchwalter, that philosophy can comprehend an epoch only at its dusk seems far too ambitious today. The relation between philosophical insight and historical experience has become so much more complex and problematic. This is not only a point about the possibilities of philosophical theory, but also about the role of the philosopher. Hegel's assumption about contemplative theory makes his rejection of a practical role for philosophers seem a kind of false modesty given the many suspicions mounted today about how ways of thinking implicitly serve unacknowledged agendas. In this setting, Hegel does indeed offer a point of reference with contemporary value, though it is as much as a statement of dilemmas we face as it is a matter of models we can emulate.