Dialogues Between Faith and Reason: The Death and Return of God in Modern German Thought

Placeholder book cover

John H. Smith, Dialogues Between Faith and Reason: The Death and Return of God in Modern German Thought, Cornell University Press, 2011, 309pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780801477621.

Reviewed by Ben Crowe, The University of Utah


Part of the enduring fascination of the German intellectual tradition must surely be located in the richness of religious thought within it. John H. Smith probes this tradition, bringing out the complexities and ambiguities of nearly five-hundred years of philosophical and theological reflection. Specifically, Smith sees in post-Reformation German thought a compelling instantiation of the more general thesis that "a certain logic in modern thought about Christianity brought about both its own undoing and the seeds for a revival of faith from a new perspective" (viii-ix).

In his Introduction, Smith sets forth the basic framework of his ambitious historical reconstruction. Like Faust in Part One of Goethe's masterful drama, Smith takes his cue from the famous Prologue to the Gospel of John ("In the beginning was the logos"), insisting that logos, in its many meanings ("reason" and "discourse" being the most well-known), is implicated in the very heart of the Christian conception of the divine (2). The resulting story is summarized thusly:

it is precisely the attempt of reason and philosophy to define a rational God and then to define themselves as that God, followed by the perceived failure of that endeavor, that has opened the way to a return of religion to replace the binding force lost by the collapse . . . of reason (8).

Smith rightly views this story as one of conflict, compromise, and even contradiction. Yet, what ultimately interests him in (re-)telling the story is the possibility nascent within it of "an understanding that sees both a rational core to faith (i.e., its inherent drive to express itself in a language of reasons) and an unfathomable and self-transcending aspect to rationality and language (i.e., their inherent drives to their own limits and their reliance on ungrounded assumptions)" (19).

As these remarks indicate, Smith's project can be seen as fundamentally Hegelian. It was Hegel, after all, who famously articulated the creative potential hidden in the contradictions of history. Further, it was Hegel who, perhaps more than any other thinker of his era, took his Enlightenment predecessors (both pro- and anti-religious) to task for thinking of rationality (logos, in Smith's terms) in too narrow a fashion, resulting in an impoverishment of religious life and thought. Hegel likewise defends his own "speculative" approach to religion by pointing to the manner in which reason had (at least until his time) been inseparably bound up with the heart of Christianity itself. Smith's narrative, while perhaps less optimistic than Hegel's (at least according to some readings of Hegel), nevertheless aims to bring out the productive tensions in modern German religious thought with one eye towards the future of religious discourse in a post-Enlightenment age.

After setting out the basic terms of his narrative in the Introduction, Smith turns in Chapter 1 to the famous debate between Erasmus and Luther on (among other things) freedom of the will. For Smith, this exchange establishes "the basic paradigm in which modern Western treatments of religion, faith, rationality, and agency unfold" (26). In Chapter 2, Smith moves on to the fragmented situation of post-Reformation Christendom, detouring outside of the German context to some extent to consider three figures (Descartes, Spinoza, Leibniz) who sought a "rationalistic" solution to the intellectual dilemmas of the age. Here, "The irony turns out to be that the very tools used to slow down the progress of Western thought toward a godless world would end up hastening it and making it more final in the end" (47). In this same chapter, Smith also examines Pascal, a figure who represents the tensions within the unfolding tradition insomuch as he "turned from the logos of the mathematical natural sciences to a conception of faith based on feeling and nonrational experience" (62), rejecting the so-called "God of the philosophers."

Chapter 3 focuses largely on a single figure, Kant; the central question for Smith is whether Kant's critical philosophy is ultimately "responsible for a major acceleration down the slippery slope to atheism" (70). He seems to answer his own question in the affirmative, maintaining that, for Kant, "God appears as a need or result of our ethics and rationality"; hence, the critical philosophy "exposes God to a final coup de grâce" from Nietzsche a century later (70). In addition to Kant, Smith also briefly discusses G.E. Lessing as a key source for the claim that religion is essentially about morality, not metaphysics (80-84). Yet, as with Kant, Smith asserts that "in Lessing we have a typical case of someone who had every intention of strengthening religious faith -- as opposed to Enlightenment atheists -- and yet who might have contributed to the opposite" (81).

In Chapter 4, Smith turns to the figure that I have suggested is really the central hero of the narrative, Hegel. Smith argues that Hegel's key concept of "spirit [Geist]" is deployed in the philosophy of religion to challenge inherited dichotomies between reason and faith and between intellectual comprehension and political action (96-7). As mentioned previously, Smith seems to largely endorse Hegel's criticisms of the dominant theological trends of the late eighteenth century (100). At the same time, Hegel too belongs on the "slippery slope" to the "death of God," for "in developing theology or philosophy of religion as a science of spirit, a Geistes-Wissenschaft that is its own product, the human spirit is grasping itself as much as it is God. The reality of God in human history makes human history divine" (98). Chapter 5 examines four anti-Hegelian figures: Schleiermacher, Schelling, Schopenhauer, and Feuerbach. What these otherwise diffuse thinkers share, according to Smith, is the assumption that "only by attacking the dominance and apparent self-sufficiency of rationality can the truly religious be understood and, perhaps, salvaged" (120). The difficulty is that, given the apparent comprehensiveness of Hegel's system, does such a critique leave anything left to salvage? (121).

In Chapter 6, Smith turns to Nietzsche, self-professed "Anti-Christ" whose place in the story being narrated in this book is beyond dispute. On Smith's reading, Nietzsche's genealogical method endeavors to demonstrate how the logos inherent in the Christian tradition turns against itself within the modern period (153-54). Nietzsche thus emerges from this account as a more pessimistic Hegel for whom the internal tensions of the Christian tradition are not productive but are instead decadent and destructive (156). Smith summarizes Nietzsche's position as follows: "the 'euthanasia' of God is not so much a 'moment' in the infinite unfolding of Geist but the inevitable consequence of the human, all too human, history of needs and wills" (157). This chapter also contains two of the most interesting discussions in the entire book: (1) a close reading of the famous §125 of The Gay Science, and (2) an interpretation of the account in the Genealogy of Morality as transcendental, rather than as merely psycho-historical (162-63).

The remainder of the book looks at twentieth-century figures. In Chapter 7, Smith discusses Heidegger as someone who took on Nietzsche's challenge to rethink the Christian tradition from the roots up. On his view, the key move that Heidegger makes is to (re)discover the "'foundational' lifeworld" as the basic layer of intelligibility within which dominant conceptions of logos emerge. Chapter 8 turns to the so-called "dialectical theology" of Gogarten, Barth, and Bultmann. Smith is clearly sympathetic with the basic move behind this theological revival, which is summarized thusly:

once some notion of an unthought and, with the tools of logos, unthinkable, 'wholly Other' of philosophy has been raised as a necessary consequence of philosophical thought itself, then 'God' can reemerge from the dead to stand in for this radical response to a self-limiting reason (265-66).

One of the most valuable features of this book is the discussion of Gogarten (208-215), a figure largely forgotten in contemporary theology and philosophy of religion. Next, in Chapter 9, Smith treats Rosenzweig and Buber, basically reading these allied thinkers as carrying out something like Barth's theological revival within a Jewish intellectual context. The final section of the book, Chapter 10, deals with Pope Benedict XVI, who has, as Smith notes, addressed a very similar narrative trajectory as does Smith in his study.

His stories about fides et ratio, therefore, clearly overlap in places with mine, and I have deep affinities with his efforts to stress the complementary relationship of faith and reason; but where I tend to see an inherent tension with the Western tradition -- with logos implicated in both the birth and the death of the Christian God, and with faith offering both lifesaving and problematic responses -- he sees a tradition imbued with rationality and threatened by 'outside' forces (258).

Another one of the more intriguing discussions in the book involves a sober treatment of Benedict XVI's controversial Regensburg lecture of 2006 (in which widely criticized comments about Islamic history were made).

Overall, Smith provides interested readers with a good general overview of some of the seminal moments in the history of modern religious thought. However, some readers might balk at various features of the account. First of all, the level of generality at which Smith examines the arguments of the figures discussed will likely leave many historians of philosophy unsatisfied. Second, historians of ideas will miss any detailed engagement with cultural, social, and political facets of the societies that produced (and were impacted by) the likes of Luther, Kant, Nietzsche, or, indeed, Benedict XVI.

More problematic (for this reader anyway) is the absence of some of the key figures and intellectual events within the narrative that Smith traces out. Of course, no history of such scope can possibly incorporate every minor figure that had his proverbial "fifteen minutes" of intellectual relevance in centuries past. But, there remain significant gaps in Smith's narrative, gaps that compromise the degree to which he succeeds in conveying the full richness and importance of the German tradition whose story he is telling. In view of Smith's detour outside of the German tradition in Chapter 2 (where he covers Descartes, Spinoza, and Pascal), one wishes that more attention had been given to some of the crucial moments within that tradition. One of these significant gaps involves G.E. Lessing, a figure whom Smith barely discusses in a chapter otherwise dedicated to Kant, but who was probably the most important German religious thinker of the eighteenth century prior to Kant. Lessing's interventions in public discourse, including especially his notorious exchange with Jacobi about Spinoza, were genuine watershed moments that shaped the course of religious thought for at least fifty years. Indeed, Smith barely alludes to the "Spinoza Controversy" of the 1780s, about which nearly every major German intellectual of the period (Jacobi, Mendelssohn, Kant, Herder, Fichte, the Jena Romantics, Hölderlin, Schelling, Hegel, etc.) had quite a lot to say. Smith similarly skips over two other Jacobi-instigated controversies, about Fichte's "atheism" (1798-99) and Schelling's "pantheism" (which came to a head around 1811).

Also largely missing from Smith's account, with similarly unfortunate results, is the liberal Protestantism of Albrecht Ritschl, Adolf von Harnack, and Ernst Troeltsch, which dominated German religious thought in the last decades of the nineteenth and first several decades of the twentieth centuries. These figures and their followers were, at their time, arguably much more influential than Nietzsche, who gets his own chapter. To be fair, Troeltsch does get honorable mention in Smith's discussions of Heidegger and of the "dialectical" theologians (186, 209-10, 216-17), but nothing like what would be commensurate to his contemporary importance and influence both inside and outside of Germany. Indeed, this elision is especially regrettable in view of the large role played by Barth and his cohort from the years following World War I in Smith's account. A similar lacuna, which becomes harder to understand in view of Smith's inclusion of Benedict XVI, is post-World War II Roman Catholic thought. The giants of German-speaking Catholic theology (Karl Rahner, Hans Urs von Balthasar, Hans Küng) all engaged extensively and in innovative ways with the same issues that Smith treats, and were in direct conversation with many of the same figures that he does discuss.

There are a number of other, more minor, issues that I will briefly mention. Specifically, there are a number of factual errors that should have been corrected at the editing stage. For example, on p. 55, it is stated that Leibniz was born "just two years before the Treaty of Augsburg concluded the Thirty Years' War," whereas it was the Peace of Westphalia that brought a close to that disastrous chapter in German history. On p. 109, Kant's famous "all-destroying" epithet is misattributed to Hamann, whereas the honor should go to Moses Mendelssohn. Similarly, at several points (e.g., p. 18), it is mistakenly claimed that Heidegger's 1920-1921 lectures on Paul and Augustine were given at Marburg, whereas he was still Husserl's assistant at Freiburg during those years. I mention these errors only because they unfortunately detract from the overall force of Smith's otherwise thoughtful account.

In sum, despite the above-noted limitations, this book is a worthwhile introduction to modern German religious thought, particularly for students or educated laypeople who are as yet unfamiliar with some of the principal figures and debates within this tradition.