Die Erklärbarkeit von Erfahrung: Realismus und Subjektivität in Spinozas Theorie des menschlichen Geistes

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Ursula Renz, Die Erklärbarkeit von Erfahrung: Realismus und Subjektivität in Spinozas Theorie des menschlichen Geistes, Klostermann Verlag, 2010, 354pp., €49.00 (pbk), ISBN 9783465036432.

Reviewed by Martin Saar, University of Frankfurt


Spinoza's Ethics remains one of the most puzzling works in the history of philosophy. This is due mainly to two facts. On the one hand, Spinoza's philosophical ambition is enormous, since his philosophy is meant to provide a systematic and complete explanatory account of human knowledge. On the other hand, the argumentative strategies Spinoza employs appear rather heterogeneous; his book includes ontological reasoning and epistemological analysis, but also a dense psychological account of the human passions, remarks on happiness and the good and even attempts to formulate a non-theistic response to the human desire for salvation.

While many contemporary commentators writing on Spinoza have chosen a narrow focus on single theorems or a limited range of systematic questions from the Ethics, others have tried to reconstruct, interpret and even defend its very systematic ambition. Ursula Renz's monograph is an illuminating and convincing example of the latter tendency. She suggests that the particularity -- and ongoing challenge -- of Spinoza's program lies in the way he frames and elaborates the question of philosophical explanation and the connection between ontological and epistemological layers of a possible answer to this question he proposes. In reconstructing this problematic as the core of Spinoza's philosophy, Renz arrives at an original and well-argued interpretation of the second part of the Ethics and also, albeit a little indirectly, at an interesting systematic contribution to current debates on mind and realism.

The book begins with a long systematic introduction outlining the guiding perspective and some methodological assumptions. It is followed by four thematic parts, the first on metaphysical presuppositions and principles preceding the part of the Ethics she then focuses on, the second on Spinoza's ontology of the mental, the third on his theory of the knowing subject, and the fourth on the connection between epistemology and psychology.

In her introduction, Renz states Spinoza's general philosophical claim as bluntly as this: "Subjective experience can be explained, and its successful explanation is ethically relevant, because is makes us wiser, freer and happier" (11). Her entire project is to explicate what it means to hold such a view and what it demands from a philosophical account to claim the general explicability of human experience. To suggest that experience can be explained (and not only had) does not require holding that it can be reduced to or accounted for in terms of physical facts, as contemporary reductionism has it. It only means that there is some knowledge about a given experience in terms of which it can be made intelligible.[1]

Renz calls such a position "realist rationalism" (14). "Realist" here refers to the (ontological) idea that the concept of explanation presupposes that it explains something more or less as it is independently from the explanation or description itself. This is why in trying to understand an experience or a point of view we can get it more or less right, and why certain explanatory accounts help us to understand "better or worse" (20) what they are trying to elucidate by bringing in more (and the relevant kind of) knowledge. This starting point sets Renz's approach from the start in contrast to idealist or constructivist readings of Spinoza that insist on the self-contained, non-referential character of his system. Her interpretation is motivated by what she claims about his concept and theory of the mind because it is here where he sets the stage for the explicability of mental acts in general, and where he proposes some indispensable (ontological, epistemological and psychological) registers for analyzing any particular experience. And it is this "integrative model of the human mind" (27) that also makes room for "biological, historical, epistemic and social determining factors" (27-28) that, for Renz, constitutes the attractiveness of his theory. What she tries to reconstruct are the preconditions and presuppositions of this approach that are meant to make up for the claim about the general explicability (or rational intelligibility) of human experience.

The first part paves the way for Renz's own interpretation of Spinoza's theory of the mind. She briefly reminds the reader of some fundamental elements of his general framework and rejects some possible misconceptions. The first and most important point is to see the "radical dissociation of the concept of substance from the theory of the subject" (46); for Spinoza, there is only one substance (deus sive natura, "God or nature"), but there can be many subjects, e.g., singular human minds. The second is her rejection of a theological reading of substance monism in favour of a reading in terms of a general ontology insisting on "just one intelligible reality," namely a continuous, "universal interrelation of all things" (56). The third is a concise clarification of Spinoza's usage of the terms individuum and res singularis.[2] He addresses the question of individuality on two levels that are related but not identical: the question of individuality (or unity) as the quality of a certain bodily composition is a matter of physics, the question of what can be called an instance (or object) of causation or agency is a metaphysical one and depends on knowledge about relations between things.

The second part gives an outline of what Renz calls Spinoza's "ontology of the mental", i.e., his basic claims concerning the reality and general features of mental acts. She shows that, methodologically, Spinoza rejects Descartes' attempt to ground modern philosophy on the question of subjective knowledge and rather reasserts "the traditional priority of metaphysics over epistemology" (85). She reconstructs his difficult and unusual usage of the term 'idea' and defends its coherence against prominent criticisms. For Spinoza, what we think, feel or imagine is part of an "entire network of ideas" (101), all of which are, in a sense, real, all of which can in principle be explained via reference to other ideas, and all of which have a complementary referent in the order of things, i.e., the objects of our thought, feeling or imagination.

Renz reads the first propositions of part II of the Ethics about the "idea of God" as only explicating, not deducing and not specifying, the general possibility of knowing.[3] In a similar way she interprets the famous "identity" thesis that body and mind are the same thing or "mode" but expressed in two different ways or seen under the attribute of extension or thought respectively. This, for her, is not a substantial thesis about the concrete relation between body and mind, but an "entirely abstract" (129) metatheoretical suggestion; it mainly rules out intellectualist and mechanist reductions alike and clarifies "the preconditions that then allow formulating theories on physical and mental phenomena" (141).

Spinoza's ontological monism, the position from which all of his more specific philosophical suggestions derive, commits him to extending the claim of universal and in principle complete explainability to the whole realm of reality. His ontology of the mental therefore is a framework that determines mental phenomena (as thought, emotions, dreams etc.) as "explainable entities" (ibid.), but in their own right. In a short discussion of the work of Thomas Nagel and Donald Davidson, Renz relates this thesis of non-reductivist explanation or "explanatory pluralism" (132) to two well-known contemporary positions.

The third part is dedicated to Spinoza's view of the knowing subject or of the human mind as the site, as it were, of experience. It is here where Renz has to tackle the notorious problem that his monist philosophy seems to lack the resources to fully account for the multiplicity of human subjects and the differences between them. In an impressive and bold interpretation of the early propositions in the middle of part II of the Ethics, she not only rejects this impression but even manages to turn it around: Spinoza, she claims, explicitly confronts this problem and develops an original account of what it means to be a knowing subject with a mind and a body of one's own in the framework of ontological monism.

Against interpretations that place the burden for this on Spinoza's "ideas of (or in) God" as the ultimate ground of knowledge, Renz insists that he frames the question of knowledge of particular things or experience as a problem exclusively for finite minds: particular things become knowable for finite minds in a local, "regionalised" (165) way, in a "view from somewhere" (ibid.), determined by a particular and situational perspective. But this is what it means to know (a particular thing in a particular situation); it is what there is to know.

Renz credits Spinoza with systematically articulating the preconditions of the attribution of thoughts and ideas to someone with a mind and a body, namely someone with a "rudimentary, body-related self-knowledge" (193) who perceives affections as his or her own; this is something that no one can (successfully and continuously) do for him or her. Therefore only a finite being that is "epistemically disclosed" (188) to itself can be said to be an individual mind in the strong sense. This is how Renz interprets, to my perception absolutely originally, why Spinoza insists on the categorical connection between human mind and idea corporis, "the idea of body".

In the fourth and longest part of her book, Renz sets out to reconstruct and interpret two main pillars of Spinoza's vision of the human mind, all within the context of her attempt to show that he indeed follows "realist rationalism" and the ambitious goal of justifying the possibility of complete explanation. The first topic concerns the question of where Spinoza thinks mental content comes from and how it is incorporated into the set of ideas the mind already has; this happens in his psychological conception of imaginatio and the affects. The second refers to his idea of what makes epistemic acts successful; this takes place in his epistemological theory of the different forms of knowledge and especially of the ideal third type, scientia intuitive, or intuitive knowledge.

Renz gives a thorough and precise account of Spinoza's conception of imaginatio as an indispensable element of all perceptions and representations. In perceiving, the mind at the same time perceives itself and external bodies that it projects as sources or causes of its own affections. These affections, "always structured by idiosyncrasies" (233) and by the contingencies of bodily features, biographical experiences or cultural factors, can in turn be analyzed and questioned. And it is here, in a spiral towards a growing reflexivity of knowing, where Renz sees the corrective or transformative, even "therapeutic" tendency of Spinoza's epistemology.

She then gives a helpful overview of the conatus principle and the basic elements of Spinoza's concept of the affects, since with these tools he tries to explain why people tend to have certain emotional reactions to certain representations. He can thus suggest a way to "grasp seemingly contingent factors determining the content of our thinking as the expression of necessary [psychological] mechanisms" (243). Understanding these mechanisms is the first step towards greater, more realistic self-understanding.

Following the logic of her own reconstructive project, the book has to culminate in an interpretation of Spinoza's ideal of knowledge. His "epistemic perfectionism" (261) presupposes a gradual approximation to truth. After discussing the notoriously difficult concepts of the idea ideae and the notiones communes, she presents her own, non-esoteric reading of scientia intuitiva. Whoever is capable of this form of knowledge knows or sees particular things in their individual particularity and as necessary. Spinoza does not need to show that this is always possible to achieve. All he needs to show is that all the necessary conditions for this kind of knowledge are -- in principle -- available to human beings: a conscious, self-reflexive mind, the capabilities to form higher degree forms of rational cognitions, the possibility to reflect on and transform one's own ideas.

Therefore, Renz concludes, the third kind of knowledge is no divine faculty, but an epistemic option that is at least ontologically "guaranteed" (273). And it even has a preferred object, namely ourselves as knowing subjects: "Such a complete explanation is most likely to be achieved regarding the one individual whose whole history we have lived through ourselves, namely ourselves" (297). The highest form of knowledge is one that combines insight into the particularity of a thing and a self-reflexive turn on the many conditions of its knowability. And since (most of the time) the one thing we know most is ourselves, a certain form of self-knowledge in which we learn about our relation to the world and the things that have shaped us appears as a plausible, maybe the most plausible candidate for scientia intuitiva.

Given this line of interpretation, it will come as no surprise that Renz in her conclusion resists the temptation to spiritualize, as one might say, the highest form of human knowledge, as Spinoza seems to do in the fifth part of the Ethics. His notoriously difficult doctrine of the eternity of the human mind, she claims, may sound divine, but it can be accounted for on the basis of her rationalist reading: "Eternal is a human mind when (or insofar as) it comes to completely know its complete determination" (316). This of course is less an actual, achieved or achievable state of mind than an ideal of knowledge, or, as she says in another context, a "limit-concept" (61).

The conclusion also shows how Spinoza's general theory of the mind can serve the practical interests invoked by him. The rationalist program can contribute to a better and freer life because its insights into the causes and determinations of our thinking and feeling provide the possibility for distancing ourselves from and correcting mental states, for extending our knowledge of ourselves in order to form new ideas, and for "reflexively bringing order into one's thoughts [in] a form of cognitive training" (314). Knowing more about the conditions of knowing and feeling will therefore always involve understanding better how one comes to think and feel the way one does.

It is only in one case where she truly rejects Spinoza's optimism; unlike him, she remains doubtful whether this rationalist ideal can really satisfy the religious desire for salvation. For her, his theory provides a little less but something nonetheless philosophically extremely valuable: a systematic theory that makes sense of the boldest claim of human knowledge, that grounds its possibility in the basic capacities of human minds, and that makes room for and gives relevance to a variety of specific forms of knowledge that would all contribute to the always perfectible enterprise of better understanding ourselves and the world.

As indicated before, this book makes an important contribution to current debates on Spinoza and his theoretical philosophy. Renz's reading in my view has two major merits. It first provides a well-argued and sound refutation of more apriorist and foundationalist interpretations. For Renz, the tendency to bring Spinoza's epistemology more in line with a purely coherentist or even idealist position is to be resisted, and it becomes crucial to see that he starts from realist ontological commitments without which his project would not have any traction.[4] The second, related advantage of her reading is to make clear that his ultra-systematic, monist program does not lead to a monism of explanation. On the contrary, his conception of the individual or singular being that is determined in a myriad of ways systematically authorizes a variety of explanatory approaches, none of which it gives priority to in principle, not even to physics. Renz's insistence that this might also encompass biographical, historical and social data makes clear that attempts to realize the program of complete explanation will be far from monist in their structure; they will accumulate knowledge in different aspects and from different epistemic fields, accounting for many different (and of course differently relevant) forms of causal determination.

Let me voice three concerns or questions all of which arise out of a general sympathy with Renz's approach. First, I fear that a certain oscillation in her language might weaken her case for the "realist" grounding of Spinoza's theory. Insisting on the "rationalist" framework of the theory, she seems to remain undecided how to account for the relations among ideas (in Spinoza's unusual sense of the word). While showing some concession to inferentialism (cf. 92, 266, 283) and endorsing Margaret Wilson's warning not to think that Spinoza equates causal relations and logical implications (226 fn. 31), she continually speaks of "causal relationships between ideas" (163). While this might be accurate in terms of Spinoza's own terminology, it might be more advisable to be clear whether one wants to shoulder the burden of showing what this causality might actually look like. It might very well be that inferentialism in the realm (or "attribute", in Spinoza's language) of thought might be a plausible model for describing the relations between ideas, but that it does not rule out ontologically presupposing a causal relationship between minds and the world. This actually seems to come quite close to Renz's intention.

Second, as indicated above, one of the most original traits of her interpretation is that it shows how deeply enshrined a certain concept of self-knowledge is in the architecture of Spinoza's ideal of knowledge. I wonder, however, how directly this affects the scope of his explanatory ambition. Does it mean that the self is the only really appropriate object, or only one of the most likely objects, of more or less complete explanation? At times, Renz seems to hold the first view, since we as subjects know ourselves pretty well already and can build on quite a lot of experiences with ourselves. But then she also has to allow for the fact that external observers (like parents, doctors or psychologists) sometimes in certain respects know more about an individual than that individual himself or herself does. But this seems to relativize the priority of self-knowledge, and there seems to be room for forms of scientia intuitiva that are not forms of self-knowledge. This second option to me seems more in line with Spinoza's scientific ambitions and the completeness part of his program; the first, more elegant one, to me seems more in line with the ethical or therapeutic claim that all knowledge serves a practical, existential purpose.[5] I am unsure whether Renz sees the tension (or even the alternative) here.

My third point is only indirectly related to Renz's explicit suggestions. Given that she herself expresses optimism that her reading can also support an understanding of Spinoza's political philosophy, I wonder how she could account for the intersubjective character of epistemic practices. Given the emphasis he places on collective learning, deliberation and the accumulation of perspectives in his political theory, it would be interesting to see whether his epistemology remains tied to an epistemic individualism or provides the resources for accounting for the non-monological nature of some cognitive processes. Renz does give some hints concerning this question, but in general seems to remain within the (usual) perspective of the solitary knowing subject.[6]

But it seems unfair to demand more from a book that already deals with such a range of issues and that manages to keep a straight line of argument. It should also be noted that it displays an impressive mastery of the existing scholarship, ranging from the state of the art analytical commentaries to many older sources from different traditions, including the not so accessible works of Gueroult and Macherey. This book makes a strong case for an original reading and is a serious contribution to the current debate on the challenge and the ongoing relevance of Spinoza's theoretical philosophy.

[1] The term experientia is not very frequent but nevertheless important in the Ethics, see Pierre-François Moreau, Spinoza: L'expérience et l'éternité (Paris: PUF, 1994).

[2] For the historical background of Spinoza's conception of ontology see Robert Schnepf, Metaphysik im ersten Teil der Ethik Spinozas (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 1996); for his systematic account of individuality see Thomas Kisser, Selbstbewußtsein und Interaktion. Spinozas Theorie der Individualität (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 1998).

[3] See also Renz's comments on the mos geometricus as a non-deductive but "systematically accumulative procedure" (33).

[4] One prominent and challenging example is Michael Della Rocca, Spinoza (London/New York: Routledge, 2008).

[5] For a comparable recent interpretation see Michael LeBuffe, From Bondage to Freedom: Spinoza on Human Excellence (Oxford: Oxford UP, 2010), ch. 11.

[6] See Filippo Del Lucchese, Conflict, Power and Multitude in Machiavelli and Spinoza: Tumult and Indignation (London/New York: Continuum, 2009), ch. 7, for the surprising argument that the third kind of knowledge ultimately depends on collective practices and refers to a political ideal.